The Cartesian Semantics of the Port Royal Logic

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John N. Martin, The Cartesian Semantics of the Port Royal Logic, Routledge, 2020, 241pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780815370468.

Reviewed by Eric Stencil, Utah Valley University


La Logique ou l'art de penser, or as it is more well-known, the Port Royal Logic (hereafter: Logic), is an extremely influential logic text written by Antoine Arnauld and Pierre Nicole.[1] The Logic, first published in 1662, was revised numerous times, with the fifth and final version appearing in 1683. Despite the text's significance and influence, and the existence of a first-rate English translation by Jill Vance Buroker, it has received relatively little attention in English-language scholarship.[2] In his welcome new monograph, John N. Martin helps fill this sizable gap in the literature and offers the first English-language book devoted to the Logic. Martin's book is "a study of the Logic's metatheory" and focuses on the Logic's semantic theory, with three chapters devoted to the semantics of terms, two on the semantics of discourse, and one on the semantics of propositions. Martin's stated aim is to explain why the Logic's "semantics should be of interest to modern logicians" (1).

While the Cartesian tone of the Logic is unmistakable, there is some disagreement among scholars about how the Logic relates to previous and subsequent logics: how much it breaks with earlier medieval logics and how much it anticipates more modern logics. One of the guiding themes of Martin's book is that the Logic is meant less as "a repudiation of its medieval antecedents," than as "a reconstruction on Cartesian foundations of standard doctrines from earlier logic" (1). He notes throughout the book numerous parts of the Logic that are novel, including several aspects that constitute important innovations, but he treats the text as, generally speaking, an attempt to reconcile Cartesianism with what the Port-Royalists would have understood as traditional logic.

Martin's book explicitly focuses on the logic of the Logic and it will be of most interest to those with particular interests in logic, especially medieval and early modern logic and their intersection, as well as those with particular interest in Arnauld and/or Nicole. The book is at times a difficult and demanding read, and occasionally presupposes a fair bit of background knowledge and/or employs a lot of technical and historical terminology. While the focus is on logic, Martin engages issues throughout the text that will be of interest to a more general philosophical audience, e.g., sensation, truth, and intentionality. Given the vast influence of the Logic, those with general interest in the other topics addressed will likely benefit from approaching Martin's book as a reference or source on those topics.

Martin begins with a brief introduction that sets the stage for the subsequent chapters and a short overview of the contents of the Logic. The first three chapters are devoted to the three basic semantic properties of ideas in the Logic: intentional content (the comprehension of an idea), signification (how ideas signify or represent things in the world), and extension (3).[3]

Chapter 1 is devoted to the Logic's account of intentional content. Martin argues that due to their parsimonious dualist ontology, the standard medieval account of signification (or reference) was not open to Arnauld and Nicole, and they instead offered an account based on an idea's intentional content. Using Aquinas as a representative view, Martin describes the standard account of signification as requiring that there is a causal connection between the mind and body and that bodily modes travel to the soul such that the very properties previously instantiated in the body are instantiated in the soul 'intentionally' or instantiated in the soul though not true of the soul. So, when perceiving a grey cat, the cat's greyness is instantiated in the soul, though the soul is not grey. Martin argues that Arnauld and Nicole cannot hold this view, claiming that "For dualists, a material property cannot be instantiated in the soul even 'intentionally'" (12).

To explain signification, then, Martin suggests that Arnauld and Nicole develop an account of intentional content consistent with their dualism and that is a reworked notion of objective being. Martin surveys accounts of objective being in thinkers including Duns Scotus and Francisco Suárez to illuminate the context of the Logic. Martin notes that in medieval accounts objective being is always an object of understanding, and that many accounts rely on objective being as a mediator between ideas and the things outside the mind they signify and/or give objective being a "special ontological status distinct from matter and spirit" (15). In his positive exposition of the Logic's account, Martin relies heavily on Arnauld's later work On True and False Ideas (hereafter: VFI) -- the first work in the infamous polemic between Arnauld and Nicolas Malebranche.[4] For the Port-Royalists, objective being is "conceived as a property of an idea" (25). Martin argues that this account of objective being appears in the Logic as the less technical comprehension of an idea, which is the Logic's notion of intentional content. An idea's comprehension consists in those modes that characterize or define it; ideas contain the modes that make up their content. The idea 'triangle', for example, contains the modes extension and shape; these modes are part of the comprehension of the idea 'triangle'. Martin concludes that the Logic uses this concept (which is primitive and has no deeper explanation than that it was ordained by God) in its account of signification in a way that safeguards its ontology.

In chapter 2 Martin returns to the Logic's treatment of signification and discusses the Logic's account of an idea's extension. Martin notes three different signification relations -- the relation a sign bears to what it stands for or represents -- in the Logic: word-to-idea, idea-to-thing, and word-to-thing. The primary signification relation Martin is concerned with is the idea-to-thing relation. Relying on the account of intentional content from chapter 1, Martin explains the idea-to-thing signification relation as: "Idea I signifies thing T if, and only if, all the modes of the content of I are true of T" (41).

One of the more well-known topics in the Logic is the distinction between the comprehension and the extension of an idea. Having addressed the former in chapter 1, Martin moves on to the Logic's definition of an idea's extension, which he suggests was new to logical theory. In the Logic, Arnauld and Nicole claim: "I call the extension of an idea the subjects to which this idea applies" (45).[5] A natural way to read this passage is as taking an idea's extension to include things in the world, though it also suggests that the extension of an idea includes other ideas. Martin argues that the extension of an idea includes only ideas and not things, more specifically "an idea's extension is the collection of its inferior ideas" (42). Martin offers a detailed account of the inferiority relation or what constitutes inferior ideas. But in brief, on Martin's reading, one idea A, for example 'cat', is inferior to another idea B, 'animal', if and only if everything that 'cat' signifies 'animal' also signifies. Martin then addresses some interpretative problems (including a discussion of genus and species) and offers several arguments for his interpretation of extension. Martin sets the stage for how the Logic maintains a correspondence theory of truth despite the fact that "true propositions and their terms are mental entities" (44).

Chapter 3 considers the structure of ideas. Especially in some French scholarship, the Logic has been hailed as anticipating nineteenth-century logic and Boolean algebra. Martin suggests that while the Logic does break ground here, including "the explanation of ordering relations in terms of intentional content," it is a mistake to read the logic as anticipating modern algebra (71). Throughout this chapter Martin furthers his argument that the Logic holds a correspondence theory of truth and discusses several other key aspects of the Logic including abstraction and restriction, and privative negation.

The next chapter is probably the most technical of the book and assumes familiarity with syllogistic theory and representations of the syllogistic in modern algebras. Martin suggests that perhaps the most significant treatmen of the Logic, both historically and theoretically, is its treatment of "the truth-conditions for categorical propositions. Throughout this chapter, Martin argues for the view that using an abstracted version of medieval supposition theory, the Logic is able to define truth in terms of distribution in a non-circular way. Instead of defining distribution in terms of valid entailments, the Logic defines it in terms of the referential properties of terms, and this allows for a non-circular account of truth. Martin also offers a thorough account of the Logic's characterization of the syllogistic's valid moods.

In chapter 5, Martin considers how the Port Royalists "explicate method in terms of logical form" (148). He notes the Logic's "distinctly Cartesian approach to method" and focuses on the distinction between analysis, which consists of reasoning from effect to cause, and synthesis, which reasons from cause to effect. Throughout this chapter, Martin devotes much attention to developing the tradition in which he sees the Logic. During that discussion he considers a range of thinkers, including Pappus of Alexandria and William of Ockham. Martin then addresses the nature of demonstration in the Logic and concludes with a discussion of real and nominal definitions.

Chapter 6 focuses on existential import and the distinction between essential and contingent truth in the Logic, and includes a discussion of Arnauld on sensation. Martin offers a helpful overview of the accounts of existential import in some of the Logic's predecessors, including William of Sherwood and René Descartes. Martin argues for the view that "truth-conditions for essential affirmations do not carry existential import, but those for contingent propositions do" (2). The book concludes with an appendix divided by chapter. Most of the contents of the appendix go into more technical detail concerning the chapters' contents.

Every chapter, to varying degrees, considers the Logic in the context of some of its predecessors. Martin's various treatments offer overviews of many figures and could serve to help readers orient themselves in some of the history of these complicated issues. This is a helpful resource to those interested the history of these topics.

I suspect that many will find some of Martin's claims controversial and others defended too briefly. And, in some cases, Martin does not engage scholarship that could have augmented or challenged his interpretations. One example concerns whether the Logic defends occasionalism.[6] In the course of explaining why the Port-Royalists could not hold a standard account of signification, Martin suggests that Arnauld and Nicole defend occasionalism in the Logic, at least with respect to body-to-mind causal relations. Martin's treatment relies on a well-known passage from the Logic: "no idea in the mind originates in the senses, although motions in brain, which is all the senses can bring about, may provide the occasion for the soul to form various ideas that might not have been formed without this occasion" (14).[7] He takes this passage to indicate that "God causes there to be in the soul a sensory perception" (14). It seems to me that the Logic does not support this reading, but rather suggests an account of occasional causation much like the interpretation defended by Steven Nadler.[8] In the passage above, Arnauld and Nicole do not invoke God in their explanation of body-to-mind causal relations. Rather, they tell us that certain motions in the body are the occasion for the soul to form various ideas -- suggesting the soul is doing some causal work.[9]

One issue not addressed that could have augmented the book, I think, is the historical context of the composition of the Logic itself. While Arnauld and Nicole are co-authors, there is some question about who authored what and how much is collaborative. While Arnauld is very much a Cartesian, the extent of Nicole's Cartesianism seems less clear.[10] This is related to some of Martin's interpretive claims, as he relies heavily on Arnauld's VFI at various points to explicate the Logic. While this may be a sound interpretive move, more defense and discussion of some of the claims that rely on Martin's reading of VFI is warranted.

For example, in the discussion of objective being in chapter 1, Martin claims that while Descartes' view on objective being is important to the authors of the Logic, "it is probably more accurate to attribute the specifics of Arnauld's views on objective being to his dispute with Malebranche" (25). Yet, he also claims that in VFI "Arnauld fills in details left implicit in the Logic" (28). The first edition of the Logic appeared in 1662, two years before Malebranche's famous discovery of Descartes' Treatise on Man and over a decade before Malebranche's Search after Truth appeared, which would have been Arnauld's major source for Malebranche on ideas. If Arnauld's views on objective being derive from his encounter with Malebranche, it introduces the question of how much of VFI is an elaboration of the Logic and how much is explaining what is left implicit.

All in all, Martin has offered a substantive treatment of an important but often overlooked text. His book is a demanding read (and has some distracting typos). It is of particular relevance to those with interest in the history of logic. While later chapters rely on and develop some ideas from earlier chapters, the book is set up so that each chapter can, more or less, stand on its own, making it possible to engage with isolated chapters. Martin's book is a significant contribution to scholarship especially on the logic of the Port Royal Logic, and will, no doubt, generate more interest in this influential text -- interest it richly deserves.


Thanks to Kenneth Pearce, Kelli Potter, Julie Walsh and Chris Weigel for helpful discussion and/or comments on a previous draft.

[1] Arnauld and Nicole were both thinkers associated with the Jansenist movement and the Port-Royal Abbey. The Logic was originally published anonymously and there is some difficulty identifying who authored its various parts and how much of the text was genuinely collaborative. See, for example, Antoine Arnauld et Pierre Nicole, La Logique ou l'art de penser, édition critique par Pierre Clair et François Girbal, Vrin, 2012 [CG], p. 365 note 1.

[2] Antoine Arnauld and Pierre Nicole, Logic or the Art of Thinking, translated by Jill Vance Buroker, Cambridge University Press, 1996 [B].

[3] Martin suggests that the Logic uses several terms as synonyms for 'signify' including 'represent' (40).

[4] This is the only text from the polemic available in English translation. For a translation, see Antoine Arnauld, On True and False Ideas, translated by Elmar J. Kremer, The Edwin Mellen Press, 1990.

[5] CG 59/B 40.

[6] Another example worth noting is a series of papers by Buroker from the 1990's focusing on the semantics of the Logic, e.g., "The Port-Royal Semantics of Terms," Synthese, 96: 455-75, 1993.

[7] CG 46/B 30.

[8] See Steven Nadler, Occasionalism: Causation Among the Cartesians, Oxford University Press, 2011, chapter 2 and Tad Schmaltz, Early Modern Cartesianisms: Dutch and French Constructions, Oxford University Press, 2017, chapter 4.

[9] There is compelling evidence that Arnauld adopts a mitigated version of occasionalism in later works like the Examen (written in 1680) and VFI.

[10] For a discussion highlighting the subtleties in Nicole's relation to Cartesianism, see Steven Nadler, "Cartesianism and Port-Royal," The Monist, 71: pp. 573-584.