The Closed Commercial State: Perpetual Peace and Commercial Society from Rousseau to Fichte

Placeholder book cover

Isaac Nakhimovsky, The Closed Commercial State: Perpetual Peace and Commercial Society from Rousseau to Fichte, Princeton University Press, 2011, 203pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691148946.

Reviewed by Frederick Neuhouser, Barnard College


In his new book, The Closed Commercial State: Perpetual Peace and Commercial Society from Rousseau to Fichte, Isaac Nakhimovsky has accomplished what I had thought to be impossible: he has made Fichte's The Closed Commercial State (1800) into an interesting text. By carefully situating this long-neglected work within its historical and philosophical context, Nakhimovsky enables us to see it as more than a misguided attempt by a major philosopher to address the political issues of his day by inventing a utopian vision of the free republic so obviously fantastic that it was widely dismissed as such by most of Fichte's own contemporaries. To his credit, Nakhimovsky does not deny the silliness of many of the details of that vision. What he shows, however, is the urgency -- and, more importantly, the continuing relevance -- of the central problem that Fichte's text attempts to solve: how to reconcile a Rousseauean ideal of free citizenship with the realities of modern "commercial" societies (marked, in Fichte's time, by a decline in agriculture in favor of industry and a rapidly increasing division of labor). Since the principal conflict here is the threat posed by international trade relations to the freedom and economic well-being of the citizens of republics enmeshed in those relations, it is not difficult (with Nakhimovsky's assistance) to see this seemingly most untimely of texts as addressing what is merely an earlier version of the same conflict that stands, even today, at the center of Europe's woes.

One of the great strengths of Nakhimovsky's book is that it treats The Closed Commercial State as standing in a long line of seventeenth- and eighteenth-century texts that debate the implications for international peace of what we would call "globalized" commerce. (Kant's Perpetual Peace [1795] is the best known of these texts, it merely continues a much longer tradition that includes works by Fenélon, l'Abbé de Saint-Pierre, Rousseau, Sieyès, and many others.) The Closed Commercial State stands at one extreme of the spectrum of positions on the dangerous implications of international commerce for political freedom and social harmony. (That this is the left extreme of that spectrum is made even clearer by some uncanny resemblances between the closed commercial state that Fichte espouses and the realities of the former German Democratic Republic.)

The radically left-wing character of Fichte's position is explained, I believe, by his unusually rich understanding (for his day) of the dangers of international commerce. The most obvious of these is the tendency of economic rivalry among states to lead to armed conflicts over access to natural resources and markets. The problem here is not merely that commercial societies have a tendency to settle their conflicts through war, but also that even in intervals of peace they are entangled in an all-consuming competition for power on the international stage that ultimately corrupts domestic political society, subordinating values of freedom, equality, and popular sovereignty to the requirements of an economically-defined "national interest." (In other words, Fichte had an acute grasp of the dynamic underlying the grave problems facing the U.S. at the beginning of the twenty-first century.) In addition, a highly developed system of international commerce tends to produce patterns of uneven development among nations, resulting in great inequalities that replicate themselves domestically and divide individual commercial societies into increasingly distant classes of rich and poor. The former leads to self-fueling spirals of depopulation and capital flight in poor countries, while the latter (as Rousseau had recognized) endangers the conditions of personal independence that are necessary if all individuals, rich and poor alike, are to avoid being subjected to the wills of others and to achieve the status of free citizens.

A further strength of Nakhimovsky's book is that it brings to light the hidden philosophical underpinnings of the largely practical and empirically oriented project of The Closed Commercial State. Nakhimovsky rightly construes Fichte's text as an attempt to articulate the implications for modern society of not merely Rousseau's political principles but, more immediately, those of his own major work in political philosophy, Foundations of Natural Right (1796-7). In other words, his treatment of commercial society in both the international and domestic spheres aims at laying bare not only the requirements for global peace but also, and more fundamentally, the conditions under which republican political freedom can be realized for all individuals within the states that populate the global scene. In this respect Fichte starts from a more robustly cosmopolitan theoretical position than most liberal thinkers, including Rawls, who tend to address international relations from a perspective that recognizes states, not their individual citizens, as the basic actors whose rights and interests must be taken into account by just principles governing international relations. Fichte, in contrast, addresses questions of international right by beginning not with the proper relations among states but with the "rightful relation [among] their citizens" (70).

In thinking through the relationship between commerce and domestic justice, Fichte's most important philosophical claim, appropriated from Rousseau, is that genuine economic independence, and not merely a set of abstract rights, is a fundamental condition of free citizenship for all. It is from this basic premise that the economic measures endorsed by Fichte follow, and it is for this reason that Nakhimovsky describes The Closed Commercial State as providing a "political economy of the general will" (155) -- or, in other words, a normative account of society and the economy constructed from the perspective of justice:

Fichte derived the economic institutions of the closed commercial state -- the withdrawal from foreign trade, the introduction of a national currency, the system of price controls, the balancing of production and consumption, and the regulation of the workforce -- as means of securing the industry [and thereby the economic independence] of all its citizens (141).

What The Closed Commercial State delivers, then, is a radicalized version of the liberal social contract that upholds the right of all citizens to work and to live "agreeably" (143) from the rewards of their labor. That this requires a planned, self-sufficient national economy, including measures to regulate the expansion of citizens' needs (134), makes Fichte's view approximate those put forward by socialist thinkers in the following century, but (to Fichte's credit) an important difference remains: for him the fundamental value that justifies the quasi-socialist measures he prescribes is the freedom, robustly construed, of individual citizens. (An important difference between Fichte and his socialist successors is that he lacks a clear conception of capitalism, as well as any sense that freedom for all might require collective ownership of the means of production.)

With respect to the end of international peace Fichte also starts from the bottom and works his way up. Here, too, his view differs importantly from most of his predecessors, including Kant, who takes precisely the opposite approach. While Kant believed that establishing a just civil order depended on solving the problem of war via law-governed external relations among states, Fichte argues that the relation of dependence is inverted and that achieving international peace first requires the creation of closed commercial states. Such states, limited to their "natural" borders and focused on achieving economic self-sufficiency, constitute the best hope for avoiding the international economic rivalries that lead to war, as well as for securing the material wellbeing of their citizens (which itself promotes world peace since materially satisfied citizens have little motivation to support war with neighboring states).

Nakhimovsky ends his richly lean book on what is probably the oddest of Fichte's texts with a puzzling but provocative assessment:

The Closed Commercial State stands as testament to the dangers of an excessively dogmatic approach to politics. Yet it remains vital not to conflate a dogmatic politics with a dogmatic system of liberty. The Closed Commercial State is a product of both (165).

I understand Nakhimovsky to mean that while most of the specific measures recommended by Fichte are naïve and impracticable -- the product of "a dogmatic politics" -- it is important to maintain respect for his comprehension of the enduring tensions between commercialized society and political freedom, as well as for the philosophical urges that motivate his recommendations: the desire not simply to subordinate the values of freedom and justice to the imperatives and "needs" of globalized capitalism. Insofar as Fichte remained thoroughly committed to "a dogmatic system of liberty" -- a politics that takes the freedom of citizens as its supreme principle -- even the most dubious of his political writings is far ahead of most contemporary thinking on how to address the ever-growing global divide between rich and poor, the debt crises of the West, and the morally corrosive effects of commercialization. As Nakhimovsky has brilliantly demonstrated, there is much for contemporary readers to be inspired by in Fichte's basic intuition that policies of public finance might be used not merely to regulate local economies and promote world peace but also to realize a robust and demanding conception of justice.