The Concealed Influence of Custom: Hume's Treatise from the Inside Out

The Concealed Influence Of Custom Hume S Treatise From The Inside Out Book Cover

Jay L. Garfield, The Concealed Influence of Custom: Hume's Treatise from the Inside Out, Oxford University Press, 2019, 302pp., $78.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190933401.

Reviewed by Emily Kelahan, Illinois Wesleyan University


While hyper specialization is probably inevitable and in some ways good, it threatens to destroy our disciplinary community. There is a formula for success in philosophy that is now explicitly shared with graduate students: find a discrete problem about which little has been written, take a position on it, and try to present and publish the result. The number of people who feel they can co-philosophize with any depth on a topic in any given room at large conferences seems to be shrinking. The popularity of "big picture" views seems to be waning. Jay L. Garfield's book is a refreshing challenge to these trends. It's a book about Hume's Treatise (all of it), written by a scholar whose primary research area isn't Hume or even early modern philosophy in the Western tradition. It engages with a plethora of problems about which a great deal has been written. Its primary audience really isn't Hume scholars in this or that camp, though Hume scholars will find much with which they can engage. In fact, the question of audience was a constant companion as I read this book. This type of book raises important questions about the discipline of philosophy itself and how we philosophize together, though I'm not sure that was the author's intention.

A student of Annette Baier's, Garfield sees his work as nothing but an expansion of his late professor's views: "If there is anything I add here, it is simply to draw insights together that are scattered in her work" (p. ix). Baier's paradigm-shifting contribution to Hume scholarship was to reveal the importance of Book II to the rest of Hume's corpus. Baier sees some components of Book I as necessary for understanding Book II and moves through the Treatise in chronological order. Garfield distinguishes himself from her, believing that "while Book I precedes Book II in publication, it rests upon Book II conceptually" (p. 224). He starts with Book II and works his way, as his title suggests, "from the Inside Out." However, as I point out below, it's not clear that he can actually get going without a brief stop in Book I. Beyond the influence of Baier, Garfield sees himself as a member of several camps, some that he outlines at the beginning and some that he identifies as the book progresses. He makes "no claim for originality" (p. 3), so it's important to see how he situates himself within competing interpretative traditions in order to appreciate his take on the Treatise. First, in terms of the skepticism-naturalism debate, he sees these two strands of thought as perfectly compatible. Secondly, as concerns Hume's skepticism, he is firm in his conviction that Hume is a Pyrrhonian skeptic (making his case most compellingly in Chapters 8 and 10). Thirdly, he sees Hume's primary intellectual contribution as located in cognitive psychology. Finally, he sees Hume's work as influenced by great thinkers who came before him (e.g., Sextus, Mandeville, Shaftesbury, and Hutcheson), and as influencing great thinkers who came after him (e.g., Kant, Quine, and Wittgenstein). Described at this quite general level, I believe these are all highly influential, if not prevailing, interpretations of Hume's philosophy since at least the 1990s. Garfield's contribution to these ways of thinking about Hume's legacy lies in his novel analysis of custom in light of the legal theory of Hume's time, his elucidation of Hume on personal identity in terms of Buddhist philosophy, and the nature of his project at this moment in time. Garfield's book functions as a sort of defense of the value of a holistic reading of a big philosophical work on its own. That is, a reading without the pressure of placing it in the context of the author's (in this case, huge) oeuvre or comprehensively within the (in this case, vast) literature. This is not merely my take; the author describes his approach this way at various points in the book. This will, no doubt, irritate some readers.

As I see it, Garfield's book has two, I fear competing, aims that somewhat negatively impact its structure and design. Garfield wants to advance a holistic approach to reading Hume's Treatise. He also wants to defend a view about normativity and its source in Hume's philosophy. Both of these aims are colossal undertakings. The book is structured around the first aim. Part I introduces his method and defines the scope of work. Part II is an exegesis of Book II and a (too) brief introduction to Garfield's central insight about custom, its roots in legal theory, and how normativity derives from it. Part III applies Garfield's novel interpretation of the nature and role of custom to several well known interpretive challenges from Books I and III. Finally, Part IV takes a look at Hume's second thoughts on his account of personal identity from the Appendix, tries to vindicate Garfield's approach to the text, and reflects on Hume's legacy. However, I wonder what this book would have looked like had it been organized topically around custom and normativity and developed those arguments in greater detail. Of course, if Garfield had done that, then the audience would have been a subset of Hume scholars and the book would lack the virtue of being something that the philosophical community broadly conceived could consider together.

Part I, "Methodological Preliminaries," is divided into two chapters. In Chapter 1, Garfield advances five principles of interpretation to motivate his reading of the Treatise. The middle three are taken to be principles of Hume's. "The Skeptical Inversion Principle" is Garfield's attempt at the familiar task of understanding the relationship between Hume's naturalism and his skepticism. Garfield contends that the secret lies in seeing that ontology doesn't ground convention, but rather that convention grounds ontology. "The Centrality of Custom Principle" claims that observed regularities in behavior function as the primary explanans, and not the explanandum, in Hume's theory. Finally, "The Pseudo-idea Principle" is basically a description of one of Hume's applications of the better known Copy Principle. It claims that Hume often shows how a commonly used term doesn't attach to an idea as a consequence of the putative idea's not deriving from an impression and then offers an explanation of what we have instead of the idea we can't actually have. With a few caveats and modifications, I believe many Hume scholars would accept that some version of these principles are at work in Hume's Treatise.

The first and last methodological principles aren't principles in Hume's theory but rather general principles of philosophical interpretation, and I suspect they will invite more disagreement. "The Cover Principle" instructs us to "close the book and read the cover" whenever we are uncertain about what the author is up to (p. 4). In later chapters Garfield invokes this principle when engaging with passages that might tempt us to think Hume is doing metaphysics. That's not what Hume says he's doing, Garfield observes, so we should resist this temptation. But context matters when interpreting the history of philosophy, and Hume especially engaged in projects he could not state explicitly on the cover. For example, if one applied Garfield's "Cover Principle" to Hume's Natural History of Religion, one would misunderstand and underestimate the work. The fifth "Principle of the Uniformity of Method" says, "Assume that Hume's arguments and analyses are uniform in structure" (p. 25). The rest of the book shows that the author has gained a lot from approaching the text this way, but, to the questions I raise in the opening paragraph, is this a good principle for the rest of us? One might take this as more positioning. Within the world of Hume scholarship, Garfield feels more at home among those scholars who find the work remarkable for its unity and consistency than among those who find it engaging because it's confounding and opaque.

Chapter 2 poses questions that seem almost autobiographical once you complete the book: "Why the Treatise? Why Book II? Why Custom?" His answers reveal more about his philosophical upbringing and considered views about how to philosophize than about where Hume scholarship is or should be headed. The second two questions have obvious answers. One might write a book with Book II at the center because that's where Hume first introduces his theory of the passions, the importance and centrality of which cannot be cast into doubt, especially since the publication of Baier's seminal work. Custom is a focus because it's the explanatory backbone of Hume's cognitive and moral psychology, an area thought by many to be Hume's most significant contribution. Garfield's answer to the first question, however, is less obvious. He's not really engaged in the long-standing debate about which of Hume's works provides the best window into his most mature, most systemic, most consequential thought or why we should read this over that. Again, the author is forthcoming about the fact that his reasons for limiting his inquiry to the Treatise aren't based on a survey of Hume's entire corpus. Garfield writes, "The organic unity of the Treatise and its enormous detail account for its continuing fascination. That's why I'm writing about the Treatise" (p. 30). This strikes me as a view about what one finds personally satisfying when doing philosophy more so than about how to understand Hume.

Garfield also uses Chapter 2 to introduce some legal theory that has not before, to my knowledge, been brought to bear on interpreting Humean custom and habit. In particular, he argues that Hume "understood customary law -- the law that emerged from local patterns of behavior and traditions -- as constituting the foundation of the legitimation of positive law" and that Hume built his concept of custom in the Treatise up from this foundation (p. 37). Against charges of conservatism, Garfield observes that custom often has the effect of enshrining the status quo, but "It is the recursivity of custom that saves a legal theory that takes custom so seriously from rank conservatism and relativism and explains how it is possible to examine and to revise our practices and values using those very practices and values as bootstraps" (p. 43). A long and interesting footnote follows this passage in which Garfield makes clear that he sees himself as offering a view about the source of normativity in Hume's philosophy, presenting it as an alternative to the Loebian stability view and comparing it to Korsgaard's assessment of Hume in The Sources of Normativity. Though Garfield takes himself to be advancing an interpretation of Hume according to which Hume offers a naturalistic explanation of normativity in terms of our biological natures (what Garfield calls "original custom") and our social development and interaction (also custom), it sometimes sounds as though Garfield sees Hume as giving an account of when our moral and epistemic practices are justified and not an account of when we take them to be.

Part II contains Chapters 3, 4, and 5 and defends the view of Hume as primarily a cognitive psychologist and of Book II as the theoretical core of the Treatise. As for Garfield's disagreement with Baier about where to begin a study of the Treatise, I don't think it runs as deep as he thinks. His "Skeptical Inversion" and "Pseudo-idea" principles are clearly derived from Book I and his interpretation of Book II depends on them. Chapter 3 reviews some familiar distinctions and wades into the perennial interpretive challenge of understanding Hume on personal identity. There are footnotes throughout the book directing traffic between the world of Hume and the world of Buddhist scholarship, but Chapter 3 is a place where Garfield really showcases his impressive study of Buddhism. In reconciling the tension that emerges when Hume seems to rely on a substantial self, a notion he roundly rejected in Book I, in order to explain pride and humility, Garfield deploys his "Pseudo-idea Principle" and the insights of Buddhist thinker Candrakīrti. The former explains how we might come to think we possess ideas we don't actually have because of how our language operates, and the latter introduces a helpful distinction between a self and a person. Garfield maintains that something like Candrakīrti's person is the object of pride and humility, and not the fraught substantial self.

Chapter 4 examines the structure of the passions, expands on Garfield's analysis of Hume on the "self-illusion," and engages with perennial questions about how best to understand Hume on free will and determinism. Unlike his engagement with personal identity, Garfield doesn't add his own analysis so much as position himself within a well explored landscape. Hume's position on the freedom of the will is fairly clear and Garfield's use of the "Pseudo-idea Principle" to elucidate Hume's explanation of why we don't have the idea we think we might have of indifferent liberty while we can have an idea of freedom as spontaneity is right in line with how many readers of Hume take him on this question.

Chapter 5 is also primarily about positioning within existing debates, this time about the nature of Hume's moral psychology. Natural sympathy, custom, and imagination are at the center of Garfield's understanding of it and he is in agreement with many scholars that one of Hume's greatest contributions is his insight that imagination is doing a lot of the work previously attributed to reason and sensation. Garfield describes the Humean imagination as more of a "primitive model for Kant's" than a "recapitulation of Descartes's" or "repetition of the Berkeley-Locke account" (p. 98), with the key difference between Hume and Kant being that "Hume, unlike Kant, sees much of what passes for reasoning not as the result of deliberate and rational cogitation, or even active but unconscious synthesis, but rather the result of blind, original cognitive processes governed by lawlike principles of association" (Ibid.).

Part III consists of six chapters all devoted to applying Garfield's Book II-custom-centered approach to interpretive questions in Books I and III. Chapter 6 explores the nature of Hume's epistemological project, including a first pass at applying Garfield's custom view to the issues of external world skepticism and causality. Hume's view of the task of philosophy, according to Garfield, is "both an empirical survey of human nature and a limitation of the desire to transgress that survey" (p. 108). Custom, Garfield argues, is what supplies that limitation. It is also at the core of Hume's Copy Principle and theory of abstract ideas.

Chapter 7 explores Hume on causality in greater detail, bringing Garfield's custom view, the "Skeptical Inversion Principle," and the "Pseudo-idea Principle" together to explain Hume's analysis of our idea of necessary connection.

Chapter 8 examines Treatise 1.4.1, "Of scepticism with regard to reason." Here Garfield uses his understanding of Humean custom as rooted in the legal theory of Hume's time to explain probability. As with a judge in a court of law, Hume, Garfield argues, thinks of judgments of probability as "an assessment of which arguments are most probative, of which have the greatest probative weight or force" (p. 157).

Chapter 9 considers external world skepticism in greater detail, examining Treatise 1.4.2, "Of scepticism with regard to the senses." Hume considers how we come to believe in the external world. Having ruled out the senses and reason, he concludes that imagination explains our belief. This is an inference to the best explanation, but is it any good? Garfield argues that "in lieu of a justification of custom, which might seem to be demanded, we will get a justification by custom, which will turn out to be all of the justification we could ever in fact demand" (p. 182).

Chapter 10, on personal identity, is a standout, showcasing all of the novel interpretive threads Garfield brings to the project. Of particular note is, again, the connections Garfield draws to Buddhist philosophy.

The final chapter of Part II, Chapter 11, "Ethics," covers an enormous amount of ground. Each section might have been its own chapter and many significant issues in Hume's ethical theory would have remained untouched. Broadly, Garfield sees Hume as providing "an account of our propensities to constitute moral conventions and to make moral judgments; that is, he will be demonstrating how our moral practices both emerge from and shape our human nature" (p. 227). He considers many perennial issues from realism and anti-realism (he argues that there are no custom-independent moral facts), to virtue and vice (unsurprisingly, he thinks of these as properties shaped and determined by custom), to artificial virtues; and, finally, to whether Hume is committed to an ideal observer theory (he thinks Hume rejects it). His discussion of the artificial virtue of justice is one of the most engaging of the entire book. It offers the most compelling application of his customary law reading of custom and the best illustration of what Garfield means by the recursivity of custom (pp. 255-256). Just where Garfield thinks normativity is located in Hume's project is perhaps most clear in this chapter. At the close, Garfield emphasizes that Hume "is not a metaethicist, but a moral psychologist" (p. 257). However, for some readers, this will be more confounding than clarifying.

By concluding with an examination of Hume's second thoughts in the Appendix, Garfield brings the two aims of the book into clear focus. First, because he's advocating for a cover-to-cover reading of a great work in philosophy, he has to take these concerns seriously. Secondly, his resolution of the problem raised in the Appendix, which Garfield takes to be that of explaining the unity of the mind, rests on his custom-focused interpretation of the text. He appeals to "subdoxastic cognitive and brain processes" to explain the appearance of unity, something we should understand as "original habit," in other words, custom.