The Concept of Presocratic Philosophy: Its Origin, Development, and Significance

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André Laks, The Concept of Presocratic Philosophy: Its Origin, Development, and Significance, Glenn W. Most (tr.), Princeton University Press, 2018, 137pp., $29.95, ISBN 9780691175454.

Reviewed by Daniel W. Graham, Brigham Young University


What's in a name? Would Presocratic philosophy by any other name be as profound and important? André Laks, a leading scholar of Presocratic philosophy, addresses this question is a slender volume, newly translated from the French,[1] about the scholarly understanding of the first philosophers. How do we classify early Greek philosophy, and what difference does it make?

The term 'Presocratic,' as our author points out, is a modern invention, coined by Johann August Eberhard (in the German version 'vorsokratische Philosophie') in a book on the history of philosophy published in 1788. But the question of how philosophy originated goes back to the Greeks themselves. Laks distinguishes a Socratic-Ciceronian tradition which sees Socrates as the watershed figure who turned philosophy from the study of nature to the study of man, and a Platonic-Aristotelian tradition in which Socrates is seen "pass[ing] from a philosophy of things to a philosophy of the concept" (1). The former tradition views the divide between the pre-Socratic and the Socratic as a change of content, the latter as a change in method to a "second-order kind of thought" dealing with "epistemological questions" (12-13). Indeed, in Aristotle's version of the story, "there is an unbroken continuity from Thales to Plato" in which Socrates is "an intermediary rather than . . . an initiator" in focusing on definitions and formal causes (16). Six centuries later, Diogenes Laertius tells the story of philosophy as a contest between an Ionian and an Italian tradition, in which the Presocratics play a role but do not emerge as a distinct group. Thus far chapter 1 (Ancient Antecedents).

In chapter 2 (Presocratics: The Modern Constellation), Laks deals with the reception of Presocratic philosophy, mainly in the nineteenth century when the contours of our present historiography of philosophy were emerging. W. T. Krug's history of philosophy (1815) identified Plato as the turning point of ancient philosophy; but Friedrich Schleiermacher defended Socrates as the true watershed. G. W. F. Hegel saw the Sophists as marking the first major turning point, but the author of the most detailed and successful (and most often revised and reprinted) history of ancient philosophy, Eduard Zeller, restored Socrates to the central role. Laks follows the complex development of Friedrich Nietzsche's views on early Greek philosophy; he notes that Nietzsche moved from speaking of the early philosophers as Preplatonics to speaking of them as Presocratics. The great philologist and philosopher Hermann Diels followed the lead of Zeller in collecting the Greek and Latin texts of the early philosophers and translating them into German in Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker (in 1 volume, 1903; expanded in later editions and edited by Walther Kranz up to the 6th edn., 3 vols., 1951), which became the bible of Presocratic studies and made the term 'Presocratic,' in whatever language, canonical.[2] 'Presocratic,' Laks observes, "has the advantage of being a linguistically convenient term" that groups together the early thinkers who were not influenced by Socrates (32). Yet the morpheme 'pre-' in the word seems to suggest that the early philosophers were fated to be surpassed and rendered obsolete by more sophisticated successors (29). And, more fundamentally, it implies that all the philosophers designated by the term lived earlier than Socrates, when some, like Democritus, were his contemporaries, while other thinkers included in Diels' collection lived up to several generations after Socrates' death.

Having discussed in what sense the Presocratic philosophers were pre-Socratic, Laks goes on (chapter 3) to consider in what sense they were philosophers. He points out that Aristotle identifies them as the first philosophers, but that raises the question, in what sense philosophy was distinguishable from other intellectual endeavors. The much studied development from muthos to logos is more complex than originally recognized. It is also difficult, Laks observes, to distinguish philosophy from science in the early stages of both disciplines. This leads to a broader discussion of rationality (chapter 4), in which Laks looks at the theory of Jean-Pierre Vernant, in The Origins of Greek Thought, which finds the roots of Greek philosophy in the structures and life of the polis. Laks balances Vernant's ideas with those of Max Weber, but in the end finds that these sociological approaches cannot account for the heterogeneity of Greek thought.

Laks goes on to discuss the notion of origins (chapter 5), and the question of how fraught with theory are terms like 'origin' and 'beginning.' And to what extent can we demarcate the epochs that we think mark stages of intellectual development? In chapter 6, "What Is at Stake," Laks deals with the philosophical reception of Presocratic thought in the twentieth century. Here Laks focuses on two continental figures who embody, respectively, the Socratic-Ciceronian and the Platonic-Aristotelian traditions, namely Ernst Cassirer and Hans-Georg Gadamer; the former approach stresses the discontinuity between the Presocratics and Socrates, the latter the continuity between the Presocratics and their Greek successors. (Laks hints that "Anglo-Saxon historiography" embodies the same debate, though without naming names, 79; one major continental figure notable by his absence is Martin Heidegger, referred to only in passing.) Gadamer sees the Presocratics as "speak[ing] with a single voice" in a very un-historicist way (83). Laks goes on to expound the interpretation of Cassirer, who seems to Laks to point the way to a more comprehensive history of philosophy (95).

The present study offers a helpful survey of the concept of Presocratic philosophy and how it was treated in classical antiquity and then developed from the late eighteenth to the twentieth centuries. Readers can gain an appreciation of the vicissitudes of historiography of the earliest philosophers. One thing, however, that seems to be missing is attention to the Presocratic philosophers themselves. Among the numerous quotations in the book, I have noted only one actual citation from a Presocratic text, and that is used only to reflect on methodology. To be sure, there is some value in taking Presocratic philosophy as a given and seeing how later thinkers respond to it. The focus on the reception of ancient texts, perhaps to the exclusion of those texts, is built in to the project. But I think part of the story must be how the discovery of early Greek philosophy is a two-way process: on the one hand, Presocratic thought provides the origin and inspiration for the discipline of philosophy; on the other hand, an evolving discipline of philosophy helps each generation of thinkers reconceive Presocratic philosophy. And one of the essential ingredients in latter process must be how philological scholarship and philosophical reconstruction provide an evolving understanding of ancient thought.

Our understanding of the Presocratics has come a long way since 1788: papyri with new fragments have been recovered, meanings of Greek terms have been clarified, the nature and sources of ancient doxography have been illuminated, arguments have been reconstructed, influences among thinkers elucidated, ancient historiographical methods expounded, and so on. Most of the hard work of building a picture of the Presocratics, however, was done not by great philosophers, sociologists, and culture critics--that is, not by the non-specialists featured in most of the pages of Laks' study—but by specialist scholars and commentators who sifted through the strata, figuratively speaking, of the archaic world. Unfortunately, we don't hear much about the latter group and their significant and sometimes groundbreaking contributions to the concept of Presocratic philosophy.

One of the major landmarks in our contemporary understanding of Presocratic philosophy is the role Parmenides played in criticizing early Ionian philosophy and insisting that what-is, or being, has changeless properties. Parmenides is now seen as the major watershed within Presocratic philosophy, as Socrates is between pre-Socratic and post-Socratic philosophy. Yet this conception is not found in nineteenth-century historiography of philosophy, nor does it have any place in ancient portrayals. It arose in the twentieth century, in the scholarly debates of specialists in the field. Another important and controversial early philosopher, Heraclitus of Ephesus, was originally portrayed as both a material monist (everything is fire) and a philosopher of flux (everything is always changing). Yet until relatively recently, no one seemed to notice how these two characterizations were fundamentally incompatible: if everything is really fire, nothing is really changing; on the other hand, if everything is always changing, nothing is any real thing. Scholars of the twentieth century have offered reappraisals of Heraclitus that show him to be a thinker with a coherent theory. The evolving assessment of key figures such as Parmenides and Heraclitus is largely invisible in Laks' study of the reception of Presocratic philosophy. The best way, in retrospect, to investigate whether Presocratic "philosophy" is genuine philosophy may be to study its own theoretical debates in their own historical context, as reconstructed by specialist scholars.

In his discussion of scientific discovery, Aristotle observes, "As often as we have accidental knowledge that the thing [the phenomenon we are investigating] exists, we must be in a wholly negative state as regards its essential nature; for we have not got genuine knowledge even of its existence . . . " (Posterior Analytics II. 8, 93a24-26, Oxford trans.). As we investigate, however, we discover the nature and properties of the practice. At this point our initial characterization may be seen as inadequate and the term used to describe it obsolete. Thus, the term eclipse as applied to the sun originally implied the abandonment of the sun's place in the sky. When we determine that the phenomenon is caused by the moon's blocking the sun's light, the term becomes obsolete -- but we still use it, and it acquires a new sense.

We might apply this insight to Presocratic philosophy; scholars start with an incidental characterization of the phenomenon: it took place before (or without the influence of) Socrates. As we explore the phenomenon, we find the term 'Presocratic' misleading and tendentious. But the name is now emblazoned on the banner of the earliest Greek philosophers, and its meaning in practice is determined by the membership and activities of that group. In Fregean terms, the sense of the word is fixed by its reference, as determined by Diels and his successors. Laks accepts the term in this book; but in the important new Loeb edition of early philosophical texts, Early Greek Philosophy (9 vols.), which Laks has edited and translated together with the translator of the present volume, Glenn W. Most, Laks and Most "avoid [the term Presocratic] as far as possible because of its undesirable connotations" (vol. 1, p. 6). Indeed, Laks and Most include testimonies of Socrates in the collection (vol. 8, ch. 33). There is, no doubt, some advantage in breaking down the barrier between Socrates and his intellectual contemporaries. But if we wish to distinguish Socrates from his contemporaries and forerunners, we shall be hard put to find another term than 'Presocratic.'

André Laks has given us a stimulating discussion of the concept of Presocratic philosophy as it has been understood from ancient Greek times to the present. His book offers the reader a chance to consider the historians and philosophers who have shaped our conception of the origins and to rethink the place of Presocratic philosophy in the development of the discipline and in relation to contemporary issues. The concept occupies an important place in the canon of the history of philosophy, but it is still evolving along with the tools we use to study the past, with our readings of historic texts, and indeed with our conception of philosophy itself.

[1] Introduction à la «philosophie présocratique», Presses Universitaires de France, 2006.  I read the French original when it came out.

[2] Laks says, “Zeller and Diels are just as much ‘inventors of the Presocratics’ as is Nietzsche” (21); this, however, seems to me to grant Nietzsche too much influence in the historiography of philosophy, in a field in which he was relatively unknown until long after his death.