The Concept of Time

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Martin Heidegger, The Concept of Time, Ingo Farin (tr.), Continuum, 2011, 102pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441105622.

Reviewed by Michael Ehrmantraut, St. John's College, Santa Fe


This book is a translation of Martin Heidegger's Der Begriff der Zeit, a text that was written in 1924 but published only in 2004 as Volume 64 of Heidegger's Gesamtausgabe. One should not confuse this text with either the identically titled lecture given by Heidegger at Marburg in July 1924, or the similarly titled 1925 lecture course, History of the Concept of Time (Indiana University Press, 1992). According to the translator, Ingo Farin, The Concept of Time was initially composed as a review article of the then recently published correspondence between Wilhelm Dilthey and Count Yorck von Wartenburg. However, while the work begins with the review in its first short chapter, it immediately thereafter unfolds into an early version of what will two years later become the analytic of Dasein in Being and Time. This text can thus be considered the "first draft" of that great work. Farin's English translation of The Concept of Time may then be of special interest to those who are already familiar with Being and Time, as well as those scholars who wish to explore Heidegger's early thought. The Concept of Time, one should note, cannot be said to stand on its own, as there does not seem to be any significant question or theme in it that is not treated with greater clarity, thoroughness, coherence, and depth in Being and Time. Nevertheless, for what it reveals about the project of Being and Time, The Concept of Time is in many ways a rich and interesting little work.

In considering this "draft" of that larger work, one is most struck by how its opening chapter, the review of Dilthey and Yorck, titled "Dilthey's Key Concerns and Yorck's General Outlook," is then later, with very few changes, placed towards the end of Being and Time (as Section 77, near the end of Division Two, concluding the chapter on "Temporality and Historicality.") In the context of Being and Time, the discussion of Dilthey and Yorck -- in fact, more a series of long quotations from Yorck's letters -- may appear to be an unnecessary, even obtrusive, appendage. The treatment of Dasein's historicity, which it concludes, has indeed received some special attention by readers and scholars, but not nearly so much as the work's Introduction, the analytic of being-in-the-world in Division One, or the interpretation of being-towards-death, for example. It is thus remarkable that what appears to be a negligible series of quotations from the letters of Yorck -- an unknown, unread, private scholar -- about the methodology of the historical sciences was initially the main entryway to the fundamental problem of "Being and time." The prominence accorded to Yorck's "dialogue" with Dilthey in The Concept of Time thus leads one to consider that discussion more closely.

The review deals with Yorck's criticisms of Dilthey's efforts to ground the human, historical sciences (Geisteswissenschaften). The dominance of modern natural science, with its Cartesian foundations and technological "praxis," forms the background of both Dilthey's efforts and Yorck's criticisms. There seem to be two questions here. First, how can one conceive the "subject matter" (Sachverhalt) of the human sciences, i.e., human, historical life, without reducing it to a natural thing? Second, is the theoretical approach and manner of knowing that prevails in the modern sciences appropriate for understanding its subject matter? For Dilthey, both questions about the human being -- as subject matter of knowledge and as knower -- unite in the philosophic question about what he calls the "connectedness of mental life" (p. 4). Yorck, however, possesses a keener awareness that the domain of the "historical" differs "generically" from that of other entities (p. 7). Heidegger clearly means to suggest that an adequate treatment of these questions about the human being requires the analysis of the "ontological characteristics" of Dasein in its "historicity" (p. 73). Such a consideration of "Dasein," taken as the "subject matter" of inquiry, will then also address the question of how human, historical life is to be apprehended theoretically, for the analytic works out the ways in which Dasein is "disclosed" to itself (through, for example, its own, pretheoretical "autonomous self-interpretation" [pp. 32-33]).

In the Concept of Time, the task of "understanding historicity" appears to be more central than it is in Being and Time. The account of "what time is" and the description of Dasein's "temporality" are presented as preparation for this problematic (pp. 2, 10). Accordingly, this text amplifies the importance of the insight into Dasein's historicity for our understanding of philosophy and science -- and that includes our understanding of the philosophic inquiry that is communicated in these texts. Heidegger thus praises Yorck for drawing the "ultimate conclusion" from "his insight into the historicity of Dasein" (p. 9). This conclusion is the need to "historicize philosophy," to, in other words, "understand philosophy as a manifestation of life" (p. 9). That Heidegger's own inquiry is historicized is confirmed later in Chapter 4: "If historicity co-determines Dasein's being, it follows that any investigation that aims to open this entity must be historical" (p. 81).

The full meaning of the historicity of thought -- and of Being -- deepens and unfolds in the course of Heidegger's later works, especially his Nietzsche (Neske: 1961). It is noteworthy, however, that by beginning The Concept of Time with this "review" of the correspondence between Dilthey and Yorck, Heidegger reveals, without explicitly stating, something about the historical character of the investigation that is here introduced. Heidegger says that his intention is to open for contemporaries the possibility of a productive confrontation with what Dilthey and Yorck bequeathed to us as a "legacy" (p. 2). With characteristic subtlety, Heidegger indicates how philosophic investigation begins and unfolds through engagement with problems and insights that are inherited through tradition. He thus reveals the historicity of his own inquiry by presenting its central problem (that of "understanding historicity"!) as growing out of the historical dialogue of two friends from the past century. In other words, The Concept of Time begins with what is described in Being and Time as a "retrieval" (Wiederholung) of a possibility conveyed through the works of a particular historical Dasein, here Count Yorck (and later Kant, Nietzsche, and others).

Of the two interlocutors, Yorck clearly has a certain priority for Heidegger -- only Yorck's letters are quoted and Yorck is said to "often think more clearly and more radically" (p. 3). At the same time, however, Heidegger emphasizes that Yorck's own interests and achievements concern not only the specific subject matter under discussion but also his own and his friend's "existence." The letters, Heidegger says, should be appreciated as being from "a friend who has just one concern, namely to help his co-philosophizing friend achieve something central to his existence, through living dialogue, and thereby do the same for himself" (p. 3). This too shows, without explicit statement, something of what it means to "historicize one's philosophizing." "Philosophy" turns out to be a kind of "practice" both within and for a historical community -- a practice that is enacted through "dialogue" or discourse. Heidegger thus quotes a statement of Yorck's in which he affirms that his standpoint is "pedagogical in the widest and deepest sense of the word" and that this is the "soul of all true philosophy" (p. 9). This pedagogical practice is not undertaken for extrinsic moral or political goals as they may be understood in common, public opinion, but lies in making possible a co-philosophizing in other Dasein. Accordingly, Yorck makes the surprising assertion that it is a "pedagogical task of the state" to undermine public opinion and "to educate people to see and observe in an individual way" (p. 10). Yorck's thinking here anticipates Heidegger's own philosophic pedagogy as a lecturer and as Rector at Freiburg University.

Yorck's call to historicize one's philosophizing seems to follow from a broad awareness that modern humanity, as a culture founded on science, exists in a state of moribund decline. Through modern science, man has become uprooted and detached from the "hidden sources" of his historical life -- sources which a truly "vital historiography" would seek to disclose or "experience" (p. 8). Heidegger quotes Yorck as writing that "knowledge has advanced to the point of nullifying itself, and man has become so far removed from himself that he no longer catches sight of himself. 'Modern man,' that is, man since the Renaissance, is fit for the grave" (p. 8). Here, one can also discern the outlines of the radical critique of modernity and the preparation for a new beginning that Heidegger will carry out in the 1930s.

As Farin maintains in his preface to the work, Chapters 2-4 of The Concept of Time prefigure Being and Time in both theme and structure. Aside from its much greater length, Being and Time possesses a systematic and methodical presentation that is more complex, coherent and clear than this "first draft." In Being and Time itself, those qualities of the work are bound up with clarity about its guiding question, what he calls the "question of the meaning of Being" -- where the "Being" at issue includes, but surely is not limited to, the Being of human Dasein. It is this latter theme -- in the form of the questions as to what "time," temporality and historicity are -- that defines the scope of the investigation in The Concept of Time. Moreover, in The Concept of Time, Dasein's mode of Being is not yet articulated in terms of the concept of "existence," and Dasein's ontological characteristics are not yet described as "existentials." This language of "existence," in Being and Time, intends to highlight the difference between Dasein's mode of Being and that of living things or "life." Heidegger will then break from the conceptuality of the biologistic anthropology and Lebensphilosophie of the period. In The Concept of Time, however, Heidegger does not hesitate to speak of Dasein's "everyday life" or the manner in which Dasein "lives its death." One can thus find here revealing, even arresting, phrases that may have been excluded from Being and Time in order to maintain precision in terminology.

Farin's translation of The Concept of Time is on the whole clear, readable, and accurate. The frequent interpolation of the German words, the endnotes, and the glossary are all very helpful aids. However, in light of the manner in which conceptual language is both understood and at work in Being and Time, the translator's decision to "replace" "Heidegger's extreme use of the passive with the more idiomatic active voice in English" appears somewhat questionable (p. viii). One wonders whether the translator has given sufficient consideration to the question of why the interpretation of Dasein presents itself in this strangely impersonal, neutral and passive "voice." One wonders whether such a seemingly innocuous "replacement" may not in fact obscure something of importance.

In Being and Time (and, in a more rudimentary way, The Concept of Time), the "formal-indicative," conceptual discourse of ontological interpretation is, strictly speaking, not to be taken as the expression of "Heidegger's" -- or any active subject's -- view or understanding. The ontological interpretation is rather the "self-interpretation" of "neutral," impersonal Dasein, i.e., the development and working-out of an "understanding" of Being that already belongs to every human Dasein as such. The "interpretation" conveyed in the text will accordingly "let that which is to be interpreted come to word for the first time" (Sein und Zeit p. 315, see also 32, 37, 161). The "extreme use of the passive" in these texts may then not be simply an awkward stylistic idiosyncrasy of a difficult author, but rather a form of discourse that is most appropriate to Dasein and the way in which it can "come to word" and thus "show itself." More generally, one is here led to wonder whether the expectations of publishers and readers for the easy readability and intelligibility of translated works may not sometimes be inherently at odds with the conditions of genuine understanding of the matters at issue. In any case, by concluding the opening chapter of The Concept of Time with the following quotation from Yorck's letters, Heidegger clearly intends that we consider the linguistic expression of his own philosophizing in this light:

For anything that penetrates to the ground of life, it is impossible to provide an exoteric account, which is why none of the terms here are commonly understandable, but rather unavoidably symbolic. The peculiarity of philosophy's linguistic expression reflects the special nature of philosophical thought (p. 10).