The Concept of Truth

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Richard Campbell, The Concept of Truth, Palgrave Macmillan, 2011, 260pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230297852.

Reviewed by Douglas McDermid, Trent University


Richard Campbell's The Concept of Truth is the sequel to his jaw-droppingly erudite Truth and Historicity, the sort of wonderful book which even jaded reviewers feel duty-bound to describe as 'magisterial.'[1] But there is a crucial difference between the two: whereas the scholarly Truth and Historicity treated the reader to a deluxe guided tour of Western thinking about truth from Homer to Habermas, the more polemical The Concept of Truth defends a way of thinking about truth which supposedly allows us to eschew relativism and acknowledge truth's value while accommodating our historicity.

Since Campbell believes that a dim and grim future awaits our culture unless we can find such a brave new way of thinking about truth, his book is written with a sense of urgency and conviction. Because of this, and because Campbell sees himself as speaking to both specialists and non-specialists distressed by the political and moral consequences of truth-debunking, The Concept of Truth will be of considerable interest to readers who admired John Searle's The Construction of Social Reality (1995), Thomas Nagel's The Last Word (1997), Bernard Williams's Truth and Truthfulness: An Essay in Genealogy (2002), Simon Blackburn's Truth: A Guide for the Perplexed (2005), or Paul Boghossian's Fear of Knowledge: Against Relativism and Constructivism (2006). Nevertheless, Campbell's book offers us something these excellent works don't, as we shall see.

Before we go any further, however, one thing must be made absolutely clear: although The Concept of Truth is a sequel, it is unlike many sequels in that it can be understood by audiences unfamiliar with the work which preceded it. So if you haven't read Campbell's Truth and Historicity, do not lose heart: you will find many of its main themes re-articulated in The Concept of Truth, where they are enriched by the addition of some fresh ideas and the imposition of a novel conceptual framework. Indeed, it seems fair to say that The Concept of Truth begins where Truth and Historicity left off, developing a handful of unorthodox ideas that were first sketched almost twenty years ago.

But just what are those ideas, and why are they unorthodox? To appreciate what Campbell is up to in The Concept of Truth, we need to begin with three fundamental questions about truth. For convenience's sake, I shall refer to them simply as Q1, Q2, and Q3:

Q1. What kinds of entities are true? In other words, what sorts of things are fit to be truth-bearers?

Q2. How are truth and falsity related? Are they opposites of the same order, or do they differ in status?

Q3. Does truth consist in a relation between the truth-bearing entity and something else?

Any attempt to answer Q1-Q3 yields what Campbell calls a conception of truth. (This is not to be confused with a theory of truth, for reasons we shall mention in a moment.) What Campbell calls the linguistic conception of truth answers Q1-Q3 with three theses which we may call L1, L2, and L3.

L1. Truth is an exclusive property of linguistically-structured items (e.g., sentences, beliefs, propositions, etc.).

L2. Truth and falsity are opposites of the same order.

L3. Truth depends on a relation of some sort between a true statement and something else (e.g., correspondence between a statement and a fact, coherence between a statement and a body of other statements, etc.).

Of course, philosophers who agree on L1 and L2 may well disagree about the precise nature of the relation identified in L3. When this happens, Campbell reminds us, what we end up with are different theories of truth: correspondence theories, coherence theories, pragmatist theories, consensus theories, and so on. But debates between proponents of these different theories are really just parts of one big and boisterous family quarrel, because all of these feuding analysts are committed to the same basic conception of truth -- to wit, the linguistic conception. According to Campbell, this conception has dominated theorizing about truth in Anglo-American philosophy for about a century, and it is now so entrenched there that it seems perfectly natural and self-evident to the vast majority of analytic philosophers. "After all," we can imagine a card-carrying member of the linguistic camp asking Campbell, "how else could anyone think about truth? And even if there were a coherent alternative, why not just stick with the linguistic conception?"

Addressing these questions is the raison d'être of The Concept of Truth, and the gist of Campbell's elaborate answers can be summed up in two theses. According to the first of these, the linguistic conception of truth isn't the only conception of truth available to philosophers; there have been other promising contenders, other plausible ways of answering Q1-Q3. (Readers of Truth and Historicity will recall that this was one of that book's major morals. As Campbell reminds us there and in The Concept of Truth, the so-called 'ontological conception' of truth championed by the ancient Greeks -- according to which truth is first and foremost an attribute of reality itself -- is much older than the linguistic conception, and the linguistic conception actually owes a good deal to it.) According to the second thesis, the linguistic conception isn't the best conception of truth available; that honour, says Campbell, goes to an 'action-based' conception of truth. According to this novel conception of truth, (a) truth is primarily a property of actions, not of linguistic items (from which it follows that L1 is false); (b) non-linguistic uses of 'true' in ordinary language (as in 'true friend,' 'true love,' 'true aim,' 'being true') are to be prized as sources of philosophical insight, not dismissed as Pickwickian or as quaint but irrelevant; (c) truth is still a property of statements and assertions, however, because statements and assertions are actions, and true statements areachievements; (d) actions are inherently goal-directed, and an action counts as a success if and only if it achieves its telos; (e) since actions thus have a kind of normativity built into them, an action-based conception of truth can account for the normativity of truth; (f) truth and falsity are not opposites of the same order (from which it follows that L2 is false); (g) relativism is wrong-headed, although its practical commitment to tolerance is laudable; and (h) we are entitled to embrace realism, endorse fallibilism, and give sceptics the short shrift.

There are many things which I admire about The Concept of Truth: Campbell's willingness to swim against fashionable philosophical currents, his heartfelt commitment to the value of truth, his wide-ranging and eclectic interests, his intellectual breadth and insatiable curiosity, and the infectious enthusiasm with which he communicates his vision. Nevertheless, I must confess that I found The Concept of Truth a rather frustrating read at points -- and not merely because I was unconvinced by Campbell's case for an action-based conception of truth. Let me mention just two of my concerns.

In the first place, there is Campbell's disappointing lack of engagement with recent work on truth. Truth has been a hot topic in Anglo-American philosophy for the last decade and a half, but one would hardly guess this from perusing Campbell's book. Indeed, readers who didn't know better could easily get the impression from The Concept of Truth that contemporary analytic philosophers have said next to nothing significant about truth or its value.[2] There is no mention of the work of Searle, Nagel, Williams, Blackburn, or Boghossian, for example, let alone any meaningful discussion of their attempts to save truth from its debunkers. Yet each of these philosophers shares some of Campbell's major concerns. Why, then, does he say absolutely nothing about how their views are related to his? Is it because Campbell regards them as philosophical reactionaries who are still in thrall to the linguistic conception of truth? (If this is the case, why not simply say so?) Or is there some other reason for this oversight? And why, one wants to know, should we side with Campbell instead of with them?

In the second place, Campbell attempts to cover far too much ground in The Concept of Truth. His medium-length book (248 pages of prose) is bursting at the seams with rich and suggestive material, some of it rather hard to digest: over-compressed arguments in the philosophy of language, detailed descriptions of the interactive model of representation developed by cognitive scientist Mark Bickhard, excursions into the philosophy of biology, repeated invocations of Hegel and Heidegger, criticisms of the correspondence theory, cures for relativism and scepticism, digressions within digressions (some of which, incidentally, are quite rewarding), not to mention a plethora of nice distinctions whose subtlety would do J.L. Austin proud. What the reader doesn't get, in my opinion, is a clear and definite sense of how all these parts are supposed to interlock logically or form a coherent whole. This failure to connect the dots in a rigorous and perspicuous manner is one reason why I am unable to reconstruct Campbell's principal arguments to my own satisfaction; and this, in turn, is one reason why I cannot recommend this book without reservations.

In short, I think that The Concept of Truth is to some extent a victim of its own ambitions, and that it would have been better if the author had chosen to 'talk less and say more' (as the old Vermont proverb has it). But I hasten to add that that much of what Richard Campbell says strikes me as highly original, potentially fruitful, and well worth pondering.

[1] Truth and Historicity (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1992).

[2] The views of Michael Dummett and Saul Kripke receive a couple of pages apiece, but Campbell only discusses work of theirs which dates from the 1970s. Still, Dummett and Kripke fare better than Donald Davidson and Nicholas Rescher, both of whom are only mentioned once in passing.