The Confucian Philosophy of Harmony

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Chenyang Li, The Confucian Philosophy of Harmony, Routledge, 2014, 197pp., $145.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415844741.

Reviewed by Yingying Tang, University of Southern California


This very illuminating book centers on an important notion in Confucian philosophy, the concept of harmony. Chenyang Li understands Confucian harmony as a property possessed by particular kinds of things. The property comes in degrees (p. 9): something could be (more or less) harmonious, whereas something else might not be harmonious at all. For the sake of convenience, let me use the term "harmony-apt subjects", which does not appear in the book, to designate the things that are capable of being more or less harmonious. Centering on Confucian harmony, Li aims to address four questions. First, what kinds of things are harmony-apt subjects? Second, what is the standard of being (more or less) harmonious? Third, what are the reasons for promoting harmony? Fourth, how is harmony promoted? Although the book isn't organized around these four questions, understanding Li's answers to them is the most efficient way of grasping what he wants to show.

To understand Li's answers to the first two questions, it might be helpful to consider a specific scenario. You and your roommate both want to stay in the living room from 8pm to 10pm. But the thing is that you both simply cannot be there at the same time. You want to conduct your academic research. Unfortunately, your roommate wants to watch TV. So you and your roommate must find a way to solve the conflict. Consider the following three possible strategies. First, you discard the virtue of diligence and watch TV together. Second, you completely ignore your roommate's preference and force her to have fun in her own room. Third, the two of you set up a schedule according to which you conduct research in the living room every Monday, Wednesday and Friday, and your roommate watches TV there every Tuesday, Thursday and Saturday. And you flip a coin to decide what will happen on Sunday.

Based on my understanding of the book, the interaction between you and your roommate is a harmony-apt subject, that is, the interaction between you two could be more or less harmonious. According to Li, a harmony-apt subject is constituted by at least two parties that interact with each other, and the parties usually possess conflicting dispositions (p. 9). He thinks that various different things could serve as harmony-apt subjects, such as a person, a society, a family, the whole world, and the whole cosmos (p. 17). Moreover, in Li's view, a subject is more harmonious rather than less if it better achieves the state of "adjusting differences and reconciling conflicts" and creating "constructive conditions for the healthy existence of all parties" (p. 10). In our example, the third strategy would lead to a more harmonious outcome than the first two strategies.

Now turn to the third question, which concerns the reasons for promoting harmony. On the one hand, Li holds that there are various reasons for promoting different types of harmony. This could be seen from his discussion of each type of harmony. On the other hand, he seems to presuppose that there is a unifying reason for promoting harmony of all types, and the unifying reason is that a harmonious state of affairs has profound aesthetic value. He takes music as the archetype of harmony (p. 39), and spends one whole chapter on the connection between harmony and music. According to him, as with the harmony of music, the harmony of all other types is based on beauty (p. 49).

I agree with Li that a harmonious subject usually possesses aesthetic value to a certain extent. For example, a person with a harmonious mental state, or inner peace, might make others who observe her life feel comfortable, or even pleasurable. When Confucius was seventy years old, he was able to do what he intended freely without breaking the rules. Picturing in our minds Confucius at this age we can sense the aesthetic value he possessed. Likewise, the state of affairs where a group of persons engage in a process of adjusting their conflicting preferences and seeking peaceful cooperation or coordination possesses some aesthetic value. Similarly, the beauty of the harmony in the cosmos often attracts a great mind.

However, I doubt that the aesthetic value could serve as a major reason for promoting harmony of any type. Let me take intra-personal harmony and inter-personal harmony as two examples. Promoting the aesthetic value inherent to a state of inner peace is acceptable or permissible but not very significant. The reason inner peace is worth promoting is not primarily due to the beauty accompanied by inner peace, but rather because of the intrinsic value of inner peace or some other momentous values. By the same token, you and your roommate might consider seeking the aesthetic value of your peaceful co-existence as a motivation for your coordination. But it is odd to say that the aesthetic value provides an important reason for justifying the coordination.

Moreover, I doubt that in principle there is any unifying reason for promoting harmony of all types. The reasons for promoting intra-personal harmony could be very different from the reasons for promoting inter-personal harmony, such as familial harmony, national harmony and international harmony. The value of harmony in the cosmos, which is one of the major concerns of environmental philosophy, is different from the value of either intra-personal harmony or inter-personal harmony. For me, harmony is too inclusive to instantiate one unifying value.

So far, I've briefly examined Li's answers to the first three questions. Now, I turn to the last question: how to promote harmony. Here I only focus on inter-personal harmony. I agree with Li on the general strategy for reaching harmony: we need to be open-minded and to be as creative as possible (pp. 20-22). In seeking harmony, we need to avoid two tendencies. On the one hand, we shouldn't exercise the tendency to avoid confrontation by surrendering to opponents rather than fighting for good causes. On the other hand, we shouldn't give in to the tendency to go all out to defeat opponents (p. 169).

Li is right that seeking harmony is similar to creating a new way of life (pp. 20-22). Take intra-family division of labor as an example. As he says,

If one person's income-earning capacity is low but is skilled at and enjoys housework, while the other person is a cardiologist who eschews housework, it may be to the advantage of both persons and their children if their division of labor is arranged accordingly to maximize their family prospect. Such a division of labor does not have to be drawn along sexual lines. (p. 113)

Li emphasizes that harmony seeking as creating new ways of life is quite different from seeking conformity with pre-fixed orders (p. 21). He uses a few other terms, such as "a fixed grand scheme of things that pre-exists in the world" (p. 1) and "antecedent patterns" (p. 20) interchangeably with the term "pre-fixed orders." I find all of the terms quite ambiguous. Sometimes, Li seems to use them to refer to a scheme of dogmas (pp. 7-8). But at other times he seems to use the terms to mean a scheme of truth as "correspondence with objective fact in the world" (p. 21). It is quite correct to say that creating new ways of life is different from seeking conformity with a scheme of dogmas. But a process of creating new ways of life is usually a process of truth-seeking as well.

Let me give a realistic scenario of intra-family division of labor to illustrate the congruence of creativity and truth seeking. Suppose that the wife is a very busy cardiologist. The husband is a freelance writer who is skilled at and enjoys housework. In the not too distant past, both the husband and the wife had held the dogma that women ought to take the responsibility of doing housework, a dogma that at the time was universally accepted by their society. One day, the wife returned home, as she routinely did, at 8pm and immediately went into the kitchen to fix dinner. She didn't even take time to drink some water. Five minutes later, the husband who was watching TV in the living room, heard some unusual noise in the kitchen. He sadly found that his beloved wife had fainted due to exhaustion. At that moment, the husband suddenly realized the fact that he hadn't been a caring husband and the moral truth that intra-family division of labor ought not to be drawn along sexual lines. After the tragedy, the husband took the responsibility of doing almost all of the housework, and the family became more harmonious. In this scenario, the process of reaching harmony is also a process of finding the truth about intra-family division of labor.

Besides creativity, according to Li, ritual propriety is conducive to harmony of all types (p. 57). Ritual propriety is another important notion in Confucian philosophy. It is not easy to characterize the concept accurately. By and large, ritual propriety concerns a conventional practice that regulates human behavior (p. 64). Many ritual proprieties could motivate the agents who partake in the practice to express a certain attitude towards others or themselves in an effective and efficient way. We can find many examples of ritual propriety in daily life, say, smiling towards each other and gift giving at Christmas. Many such practices express mutual respect or mutual concern effectively and efficiently. I agree with Li that, for any type of harmony, some proper forms of ritual propriety might be conducive to it. But we must be cautious. Establishing a ritual propriety shouldn't be at the expense of creativity and truth-seeking.

Li undertakes a significant and difficult project. Seeking harmony is momentous in our times, as we oftentimes run into all kinds of conflicts. Li suggests we take a profound aspect of Confucian philosophy seriously, that is, we should seek ways of solving the conflicts between ourselves and others without having anyone make unjustified sacrifices. As Confucius says, "cultivated persons seek harmony but not sameness" (Analects 13. 23). I recommend this book to everyone who is interested in seeking a better self, a better life, or a better world, especially those people who are interested in finding the answers from ancient Chinese wisdom.