The Construction of Human Kinds

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Ron Mallon, The Construction of Human Kinds, Oxford University Press, 2016, 250pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198755678.

Reviewed by Michael Root, University of Minnesota


Ron Mallon's aim is to "set the record straight" on the nature and reality of human kinds, the categories used to classify people, and explain how race, as well as a number of other prominent human categories, can be made-up or invented and yet real, causally significant and scientifically meaningful. His aim, Mallon tells us, is not to defend a social constructionist account of any particular human category but show how such an account is consistent with a realist as well as a scientific approach to categorization.

Mallon's book is divided into nine chapters. The first looks at race and how or in what respect race is real and of scientific importance. The second discusses a number of prominent claims that one or another human category is constructed (not natural) and how these claims are best understood. The third explains how a category can be constructed and yet have causal powers, support induction, prediction and explanation in the social as well as biomedical sciences.

The fourth considers the claim that members of a natural (e.g., biological) human category are less responsible for what they do than members of a constructed or made-up one. According to Mallon, calling a human category "natural" can reduce the likelihood that a member will be held responsible for his kind-like behavior and, as a result, reduce the cost; the reduction in cost, in turn, can increase the behavior's likelihood. Calling a category "natural," in other words, can create a moral hazard, a situation in which an actor has a reduced incentive to forego a behavior because he is protected from the consequences. Some constructionists, Mallon conjectures, might be motivated or inclined to call a category "constructed" rather than "natural" based on considerations of responsibility, but Mallon offers no evidence to support his conjecture.

The fifth chapter discusses some accounts, notably by Ian Hacking and Anthony Appiah, of how people come to be typical of their kind (men to be manly or whites to act or think whitely) and fit many of the stereotypes associated with the category, even though the category is not natural but made-up. According to Mallon, they explain the category-typical behavior as a performance, the effect of acting out a social role. Mallon looks for a causal model, a depiction of the psychological states or processes, underlying the performance or invoked by the role.

The sixth chapter compares a number of different forms of constructionism and realism and considers how, according to each, a category can be both constructed and real. The seventh considers how a category can be constructed, dependent on how we represent or label one another, and still be stable or unchanging enough to be the object of knowledge or to enter into scientific theories or generalizations. Members who occupy a social role, Mallon explains, can be expected to act or look as the role requires; occupying the role, abiding by the norms, can create or stabilize a property-cluster kind well enough to support our epistemic projects.

Chapter eight is about the reference of human kind terms and, in particular, their reference given a constructionist view of categorization. What, for example, is the referent of "race" or "black," "white," and "Asian" if race is not natural but made-up, and how do such terms succeed in referring if many our ordinary beliefs about the kind, about race, are mistaken (e.g., the belief that race is biological)?

Mallon suggests in this chapter that an externalist or causal-historical approach to reference, in contrast to a descriptivist one, can explain how a term comes to refer to a constructed kind, much as the historical approach might explain how a term comes to refer to a natural one. He writes:

With this picture of reference in place, we now return to where we began. We can imagine that as ideas about race, or sex, or homosexuality, or multiple personality disorder came to have causal power, they differentiated putative category members from others in more and more robust ways. These aspects then became noticed, theorized about, and ultimately became a crucial part of the phenomena to be explained by our use of the respective human kind terms. The reference of such terms ultimately shifted from whatever it was before to the social role kinds (or combined kinds) that use of the terms brought into being. (p. 204)

According to Mallon, a term like "Asian" comes to refer, through a causal-historical process, to a property cluster created and stabilized by the social role expected of members of the kind. In living the role, people come to display or instantiate the properties within the cluster, and the term "Asian" comes to refer to them.

In the concluding chapter Mallon explains how his constructivist account of race differs from naturalist or biological accounts and from racial skepticism, the view that "race" has no referent or is not real but only nominal or imagined. While he defends an anti-essentialist view of race, viz. members of the same race do not share an essence, he maintains, no less than the essentialist does, that there can be law-like generalizations about race or particular racial populations.

The last chapter reminds us some of the book's central points. First, a human kind can be constructed and, at the same time, no less scientific than a natural one. Second, a human kind like race can dispose members of the kind to look and behave in a kind-typical way. Third, different projects drive our concerns about human categories; many are explanatory but not all; some are normative and explain how the categories into which we place ourselves can regulate us. Fourth, a constructionist account of human kinds is consistent with a scientific framework in at least two different ways: first, a constructed kind can enter into scientific generalizations and explanations, e.g., blacks in the U.S. are at greater risk of heart disease than whites; and second, the origin of a constructed kind can be studied scientifically, e.g., cognitive science can study the cognitive mechanisms that prompt us to divide each other by kind or act in kind-typical ways.

In science and everyday life humans are divided, fall or placed into categories or kinds and differ depending on the category to which they belong. However, categories differ no less than people do. Some are natural, independent of our intentions or labels, while others are made up or due to how we think or speak. Some are causally significant, others inert, with little or no explanatory or predictive power. Some are real or objective and others unreal or only nominal.

Race is an especially interesting and perplexing human category because, at some time or place, race has been said to be to each of the above. According to some, race is real, to others not. To some race is natural, a matter of a person's genetic make-up or biological lineage. To others race is constructed or made-up. To some race is scientific, to others not. Race has been and continues to be a widely used but contested category, and the use of racial terms and categories prompts confusion as well as controversy within philosophy no less than within politics and biology.

Mallon's book is meant to make this war of words understandable or, at least, less perplexing. According to him, race is not biological but instead is scientifically meaningful because, though constructed, the category is projectable (supports induction and prediction) and enters into descriptions and explanations in a number of biomedical and social sciences. Moreover, though race is constructed, according to Mallon, there is a human psychological tendency and maybe an innate adaptive psychological mechanism to categorize people by kinds like race and think that members of different kinds have different essences (underlying, inborn properties that explain many of the observed physical and behavioral differences between members of different kinds). As a result, though racial categories have changed over time (or vary from place to place), many people now, as in the past, think or speak of each other as divisible into race-like categories.

While there is no specific mental mechanism designed to classify people by race, according to Mallon, some aspects of contemporary racial classification are developmentally invariant across times and cultures. On his view, though race is not a natural (biological) kind, it can be natural to think so. In this respect at least, Mallon parts company with many racial constructionists who maintain that there was no concept equivalent to race before the modern age or that the Greeks and Romans did not classify people into anything like racial categories.

Mallon allows that many common thoughts (folk theories) about race are mistaken but maintains that they are rooted in how people naturally think and, as a result, though correctable, our traditional beliefs about race and racial groups are stubborn or somewhat resistant to change, even in the face of contrary evidence.

Mallon's book is more informed by recent works in cognitive science than most recent philosophical writing about race. Moreover, his account of how making up people, constructing human kinds, can be a natural thing to do even though the kinds are not themselves natural is original and interesting.

Few of Mallon' chapters will be of much interest to those outside of philosophy and, in particular, to those in the biomedical and social sciences who use racial and other human categories to describe or explain differences between people and populations in health or socioeconomic status. For them, the primary issue is not whether the kinds are constructed or real but how best to assign individuals to the categories and which way of assigning them best describes or explains human variation. Nevertheless, Mallon's book is a useful guide for readers with an interest in metaphysics and little familiarity with recent writing on race.