The Construction of Logical Space

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Agustín Rayo, The Construction of Logical Space, Oxford University Press, 2013, 220pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199662623.

Reviewed by Cian Dorr, New York University


Agustín Rayo's central thesis is "Trivialist Platonism", the claim that that all sentences of the following form are true:

NUMBERS: For the number of the Fs to be n just is for there to be exactly n Fs.

But Rayo's defence of Trivialist Platonism is intended to have much broader application, extending for example to claims like these (p.3):

(1)  For Susan to instantiate the property of running just is for Susan to run.

(2)  For Socrates’s death to take place just is for Socrates to die.

(3)  For there to be a table just is for there to be some things arranged tablewise.

In Rayo's hands, claims like these serve as the centrepieces of an ambitious attempt to revive something of the spirit of Carnapian anti-metaphysics. His book provides a timely and provocative counterblast to the increasing prominence in the metaphysics literature of questions (e.g., about grounding) that would have struck the logical empiricists as paradigms of metaphysical 'nonsense'. But claims like NUMBERS and (1)-(3) are clearly of great interest even apart from their role in this broader project.

To clarify: with good reason, Rayo takes 'For it to be the case that Φ just is for it to be the case that Ψ' to entail 'For it to be the case that Ψ just is for it to be the case that Φ'. In putting forth NUMBERS, he is not saying or implicating that some asymmetric relation holds between 'The number of the Fs is n' and ‘There are exactly n Fs'. There is no suggestion that sentences about numbers do not have the logical forms they seem to have, or that numbers are non-fundamental, or anything of the sort. Nor is NUMBERS supposed to be a special case of some more general schema which includes, for each sentence Φ about numbers, an instance 'For it to be the case that Φ is for it to be the case that Ψ', where Ψ is not about numbers.

Another of Rayo's characteristic theses (p. 49) can be expressed schematically as follows (my label):

Intensionalism: (For it to be the case that Φ just is for it to be the case that Ψ) iff it is metaphysically necessary that (Φ iff Ψ).

Given Intensionalism, all we need for NUMBERS is the following schema, which most philosophers who are not nominalists would be happy to grant:

MODAL NUMBERS: It is metaphysically necessary that: the number of the Fs is n iff there are exactly n Fs.

Some qualification is in order, however. Rayo suspects that different philosophers mean different things by 'metaphysically necessary, and that the right-to-left direction of intensionalism is not true on all disambiguations. It is thus not so clear how widely we should take the relevant reading of MODAL NUMBERS to be endorsed, since it is not clear which anti-nominalists are using 'metaphysically necessary' in the sense that, according to Rayo, makes Intensionalism true.

One might be tempted to eliminate the potentially equivocal 'metaphysically necessary' by taking it to be stipulatively defined by Intensionalism. But Intensionalism has important and controversial consequences that do not involve 'metaphysically necessary'. Since Rayo assumes that 'It is metaphysically necessary that (Φ iff Ψ)' is true whenever Φ and Ψ are equivalent in classical predicate logic, Intensionalism commits him to

Logical Equivalence⌈ For it to be the case that Φ just is for it to be the case that Ψ is true whenever ⌈ Φ iff Ψ  is a theorem of classical logic.

Indeed, Rayo accepts something stronger:

Mathematical Equivalence⌈ For it to be the case that Φ just is for it to be the case that Ψ is true whenever  Φ iff Ψ  is a theorem of arithmetic.

Let us understand 'arithmetic' in such a way that all sentences of the form 'The number of Fs is n iff there are exactly n Fs' count as theorems of arithmetic; then Mathematical Equivalence subsumes both NUMBERS as well as Logical Equivalence.

The book is unusually structured: the first four chapters are labelled as 'Main Texts', while the remaining four are 'Detours', effectively appendices which further develop certain tangential points. There are also three actual technical appendices. Here I will concentrate on the Main Texts, and especially on the parts that give arguments for Mathematical Equivalence or against competing views.

* * * * *

The first such argument, in Chapter 1, is an argument against a competing view called 'metaphysicalism'. Although Rayo acknowledges that explicit endorsements of this view are not easy to find, he suspects — not unreasonably — that many metaphysicians have been implicitly committed to something like it. As Rayo explains metaphysicalism, it involves a lot of ideology for which Rayo himself has no use (e.g., 'limning metaphysical structure'). But there is a doctrine in the vicinity for which no such ideology is required: namely, that ⌈ For it to be the case that Φ just is for it to be the case that Ψ  can be true in English only when Φ and Ψ are syntactically isomorphic modulo the substitution of complex constituents for simple ones, in such a way that corresponding constituents also enter into true identities or 'just is'-sentences.[1]  While Rayo’s metaphysicalists may not be committed to this 'isomorphism constraint' in full generality, they are clearly committed to it when both Φ and Ψ are 'atomic sentences'. The unrestricted version of the constraint is clearly inconsistent with NUMBERS and Intensionalism, since 'The number of Fs is n' and 'There are exactly n Fs' are not isomorphic in the relevant sense, and nor are, e.g., 'Snow is white' and 'Snow is white and grass is either green or not green'. And as Rayo understands 'atomic sentence', even the restriction of the constraint to atomic sentences is inconsistent with some of the 'just is'-sentences he accepts, such as (1) and (2) above.

Rayo's main argument against metaphysicalism can be loosely paraphrased as follows. The metaphysicalist’s constraint does not hold for every possible language, since we can introduce new sentences by stipulating them to be synonymous with old ones, even without syntactical isomorphism. But ordinary speakers' communicative purposes would be just as well served by a language that did not meet the constraint as by one that did. So there is no reason to think that English meets the constraint (10-11).

This argument depends on a controversial assumption, namely that considerations about what would serve our purposes are the only relevant ones in determining whether our language obeys the constraint. Metaphysicalists might be expected to respond that speaking such a language is something we do 'by defaul'’, in the same way that (on the familiar Lewisian account) we 'by default' find ourselves speaking a language with words for relatively natural properties rather than words for unnatural properties.

Even if Rayo's argument against metaphysicalism were fully successful, it would not work against a view according to which there are some languages that do meet the metaphysicalist's constraint, even if English does not. Rayo claims to be neutral about this kind of 'moderate metaphysicalism', since as he points out it is compatible with NUMBERS (a schema whose instances are sentences of English). But given his endorsement of Intensionalism, he cannot be neutral about whether there are possible languages meeting the unrestricted version of the isomorphism constraint: even an ideal language will surely have pairs of logically equivalent but syntactically non-isomorphic sentences. Given the crucial role Intensionalism plays in Rayo's view, it would have been helpful to have spent more time discussing such rival positions.

* * * * *

A second strand of argument, developed in Chapter 2, turns on some very general claims about the right methodology for accepting and rejecting 'just is'-sentences. This methodology is framed in terms of costs and benefits:

The cost of [accepting a 'just is'-sentence] is a decrease in the range of theoretical resources one has at one's disposal. (By accepting 'to experience the sensation of being red just is to be in brain state R', for example, one loses the ability to account for Mary's cognitive accomplishment by deploying possibilities whereby Mary's brain is in state R but she is not experiencing the sensation of seeing red.) The benefit of the reduction is that one is relieved from the need to answer certain questions. (For instance, 'Why do people in brain state R experience the sensation of seeing red, instead of an "inverted" sensation?'). (p. 37)

In applying this methodology, Rayo says that the benefit of accepting NUMBERS is that it 'eliminates the need to answer questions such as the following':

I can see that there are no dinosaurs. What I want to know is whether it is also true that the number of the dinosaurs is Zero. And I would like to understand how one could ever be justified in taking a stand on the issue, given that we have no causal access to the purported realm of abstract objects. (p. 74)

According to Rayo, this benefit is worth the cost of being 'no longer in a position to work with scenarios in which there are no numbers', on the grounds that 'the availability of such scenarios is not very likely to lead to fruitful theorizing' (p. 74).

In what sense does accepting NUMBERS 'eliminate the need to answer' the questions Rayo mentions? 'Φ, but is it also true that Ψ?' plausibly presupposes that 'For it to be the case that Φ is for it to be the case that Ψ' is false; so given NUMBERS, 'Is it also true that the number of the dinosaurs is Zero?' suffers from presupposition failure. But focusing on a presupposition-laden question seems a cheat, given that accepting any sentence whatsoever will eliminate the need to answer any question that presupposes its negation. NUMBERS does not eliminate the need to answer the question 'Is the number of the dinosaurs Zero?’' rather it entails that it has the same answer as 'Are there no dinosaurs?'. Nor does NUMBERS eliminate the need to answer 'How are we justified in taking a stand on the question whether the number of the dinosaurs is Zero?', although it does suggest a certain strategy for answering it (namely, to explain how we are justified in accepting NUMBERS and that there are no dinosaurs). Given the difficulty in making out the contrast between answering questions and being relieved from the need to answer them, Rayo's account of the ‘benefits’ that support acceptance of a ‘just is’-sentence does not take us very far.

Rayo's account of the cost side of the ledger is also under-explained. The most helpful example of a cost is the one quoted above, about losing the ability to account for Mary’s cognitive accomplishment in a certain way. But Rayo does not think accounting for cognitive accomplishments always requires positing metaphysical possibilities consistent with what is known before the accomplishment but not with what is known after the accomplishment. For example, we seem to be able to account adequately for the accomplishment of those who learn that water is H2O without needing to posit possible worlds with water but no H2O; indeed, Rayo also thinks he can account for Mary's accomplishment without positing possible worlds where brain state R occurs without the experience of red. Given the availability of these alternatives, why does the need to account for cognitive accomplishments ever generate pressure to reject a 'just is'-sentence? Because of this lacuna, I am not convinced that Rayo's methodology supports 'trivialism' about arithmetic any more strongly than it supports 'trivialism' about (for example) the laws of physics. Once explanations within physics run out, it would indeed be something of a relief to be able to forestall further 'Why?' questions by citing a 'just is'-sentence. 'Why are there fewer families of particles than dimensions of spacetime?' — 'What do you mean why? For there to be fewer families of particles than dimensions of spacetime is just for three to be less than four!'

Rayo's suggestions about methodology do help to make it plausible that there is a workable way of reasoning about 'just is'-sentences that would lead one to accept NUMBERS. But they are not yet developed to the point where we can clearly see which 'just is'-sentences they favour and which they oppose.

* * * * *

A third strand of argument turns on certain artificial languages in which meanings are conferred by stipulation. In chapter 3, Rayo develops a strategy for assigning meanings to sentences in a certain language in such a way that the theorems of arithmetic end up being metaphysically necessary. (The language in question is a two-sorted first-order language, with distinct 'arithmetical' and 'non-arithmetical' terms, 'successor', 'plus' and 'times' functors that build new arithmetical terms out of old ones, and a 'numbering' operator # that takes a variable and a formula and yields a numerical term.) Rayo's strategy takes the form of a theory recursively specifying conditions for a sentence to be true at a possible world (under an assignment). The distinctive feature of the semantics is the 'outscoping' of numerical variables and formulae involving them, so that, e.g., we get theorems looking like (4):

(4) '∃n(#x(Star(x)) = n ∧ n+n=n)' is true at w iff some number is the number of things such that, at w, they are stars, and is such that it is the result of adding itself to itself.[2]

By contrast, a more familiar, 'homophonic' semantic theory would only issue in theorems along the lines of (5); to get to (4) we would need the further non-semantic premise that facts about numbering and addition are non-contingent:

(5) ∃n(#x(Star(x))=n ∧ n+n=n)' is true at w iff something that is a number at w is such that, at w, it numbers the things such that, at w, they are stars, and at w, it is the result of adding itself to itself.

Of course, since Rayo thinks that the relevant mathematical facts do in fact hold at every world, he thinks that the 'homophonic' semantics is correct for any language for which the 'outscoping' semantics is correct.

What is the outscoping semantics supposed to achieve? According to Rayo, a proper defense of trivialism would need to [explain] what would be required of the world in order for the truth-conditions of an arbitrary arithmetical sentence to be satisfied' (p. 76), and the outscoping semantics achieves this. However, I am not sure how to understand this goal in such a way that the homophonic semantics does not also achieve it. The central difference between the two is that all Platonists will agree that a language for which the outscoping semantics is correct is one in which theorems of arithmetic have trivial truth-conditions, whereas only Trivialist Platonists will agree with this as regards the homophonic semantics. But what is the objection to Trivialist Platonism to which only the former theory provides a response?

Someone might put the outscoping semantics to work in a positive argument for Trivialist Platonism, roughly as follows: for reasons of interpretative charity, we should if possible interpret English-speakers as speaking a language in which the theorems of arithmetic express necessary truths, rather than a language in which they express contingent truths; but the outscoping semantics shows such an interpretation is possible; so English is such a language. This strikes me as a promising form of argument, though not one that Rayo explicitly develops. One might worry, however, that the relevant targets — Platonists who are not Trivialist Platonists — will typically reject Intensionalism, and thus will not regard a semantic theory that merely assigns possible-worlds truth conditions as an adequate specification of an interpretation in the relevant sense.

* * * * *

Chapter 4 introduces a fourth strand of argument, concerning the epistemology of mathematics. Again, it is targeted towards non-Trivialist Platonists rather than nominalists. The argument is that it is hard for non-Trivialist Platonists to explain how we could ever know any interesting mathematical truth, whereas this is not hard for Trivialist Platonists. Rayo's exposition of the problem for non-Trivialist Platonism is brief, and it does not venture far beyond Paul Benacerraf’s discussion in 'Mathematical Truth'; the work of the chapter is showing how Trivialist Platonism enables a distinctive explanation of mathematical knowledge. The outlines will be familiar to readers of Robert Stalnaker's Inquiry. The cognitive state of someone lacking mathematical knowledge is modelled by a collection of mathematically omniscient 'fragments', whose control over the subject’s behaviour is limited to certain tasks. For example, if one knows the Peano Axioms but not Fermat's Last Theorem, the fragments that control one’s linguistic behaviour with respect to the axioms believe contingent truths about what the axioms mean in English, but the fragment that takes over when one is asked about Fermat's Last Theorem does not believe these truths. Finding a proof introduces new 'accessibility' relations between fragments. This account of how we come to believe new mathematical truths is supposed to explain why such beliefs can be knowledge — presumably the thought is that, since beliefs one acquires simply by becoming less fragmented are automatically true, the truth of each such belief is non-accidental in the way that matters for knowledge.

Although Rayo's way of explaining apparent failures of logical and mathematical omniscience builds in several ways on Stalnaker's, it is unlikely to convince those who thought that Stalnaker's approach was wrongheaded. It is, nevertheless, an interesting new dialectical twist for the fact that such approaches make it easy for attributions of logical and mathematical knowledge to be true to be treated as a great advantage rather than primarily as a problem to be overcome. My main worry is that Rayo's discussion is mostly geared towards explaining how we advance from knowledge of axioms to knowledge of theorems. But the primary epistemological worry for non-Trivialist Platonists is about how we know the axioms in the first place. To use the fragmentation model to address this worry, we would need to apply it to those who do not believe the axioms, such as dyed-in-the-wool nominalists. It is not hard to see how this could go: for example, we could say in such a nominalist, the fragment concerned with answering the question 'Is the number of dinosaurs Zero?' fails to believe that there are no dinosaurs, although the fragment concerned with 'Are there dinosaurs?' does believe this. One would presumably need to take the same view about all cases of failure to know metaphysically necessary truths: e.g., the cognitive states of chemists before the discovery that water is H2O. But this extension of the fragmentation theory diminishes its capacity to explain knowledge of mathematics. Since chemists sometimes make mistakes, the processes that lead to defragmentation must sometimes misfire in ways that are completely opaque to the subject; but in that case it is no longer so clear why beliefs resulting from successful defragmentation should automatically count as knowledge.

* * * * *

I have not yet mentioned the most strikingly Carnapian aspect of Rayo's view, which emerges in chapter 2. (While he emphasises that this material is independent of the rest of the book, it does shed new light on the other theses and arguments.) In short: Rayo doubts that 'just is'-sentences are true or false 'objectively'; he holds that it 'makes no sense' to talk of their truth or falsity 'independently of the aims of a particular community' (p. 62). The book as a whole is thus reminiscent of an argument for the combination of some first-order normative claims, such as utilitarianism, with ethical relativism. (Not that there is anything incoherent about this!)

For Rayo, the non-objectivity of 'just is'-sentences flows from a thesis about the nature of truth in general, as relative to 'conceptions of logical space':

the notion of truth presupposes a conception of logical space: the distinction between the true and the untrue is just the distinction between regions of logical space that include the way the world actually is, and those that do not. In the case of a contingent statement, truth or falsity will nevertheless be constrained by something other than one's conception of logical space. For one’s conception will not, on its own, decide the issue of which point in logical space happens to be actualized. But in the case of 'just is'-statements, truth or falsity will be determined entirely by the background conception of logical space. Every conception of logical space will count those 'just is'-statements on which it is based as true, and the rest as false. (p. 58)

The view is that a single interpreted sentence can be true relative to some conceptions of logical space and false relative to others. When one asserts an ordinary sentence, there is some particular conception of logical space that one is ‘presupposing’: one speaks truly if and only if the sentence uttered is true (in the relevant language) relative to that conception. But utterances of 'just is'-sentences normally do not 'presuppose' any particular conception of logical space, and hence cannot be evaluated as true or false in the same way. Rather, an utterance of a 'just is'-sentence advocates a certain class of conceptions, namely those on which that sentence is true. According to Rayo's favoured view, the only sense in which such acts of advocacy can be 'correct' or 'incorrect' is pragmatic, turning on facts about which conceptions best serve our purposes.

Rayo is thus committed to a form of global relativism, and his view faces many of the standard challenges for that view. For example, the claim that an ordinary utterance is true iff the (interpreted) sentence uttered is true relative to the conception of logical space that is presupposed looks inconsistent with the seemingly truistic claim that when a sentence means that P, an utterance of that sentence is true iff P. Moreover, if a notion of truth characterised by the latter claim is even coherent, it is hard to see how it could fail to provide the non-pragmatic standard of correctness for ‘just is’-sentences whose existence Rayo denies.

But rather than dwelling on such issues, let me raise some challenges specific to Rayo's view. One is to explain what it means for a sentence to be true relative to a conception of logical space. A conception of logical space is specified by a list of 'just is'-sentences. These sentences and (typically) their logical consequences will be true according to the conception. But this does not get us very far. Consider:

(6) Everything that experiences the sensation of seeing red is in brain state R.

Since (6) is a logical consequence of (7), it is true on conceptions on which (7) is true:

(7) To experience the sensation of seeing red just is to be in brain state R.

And assuming that some things — insects, say — are in brain state S but not brain state R, (6) is presumably false relative to conceptions on which (8) is true:

(8) To experience the sensation of seeing red just is to be in brain state R or brain state S.

But what about a 'dualistic' conception relative to which neither (7), nor (8), nor any other 'just is'-sentence giving non-psychological necessary and sufficient conditions for a psychological property is true? Even if we ourselves have embraced (7) or (8), we are still stuck with 'awkward questions' about which sentences are true relative to conceptions other than the one we accept. Another example: consider a conception like ours except that it contains (10) where we have (9):

(9) To be ethanol just is to be C2H5OH.

(10) To be ethanol just is to be CH3OH.

(CH3OH is the actual formula for methanol). Since (10) logically entails 'All ethanol is CH3OH', either (11) or (12) must be false according to the latter conception:

(11) Vodka contains a high proportion of ethanol.

(12) Vodka contains very little CH3OH.

But which one?[3]

Another challenge facing Rayo is to say what it is for a conception of logical space to be 'presupposed' by an utterance. Rayo generally assumes that the presupposed conception is the one the speaker accepts (for relevant purposes). But it is false that each speaker accepts some conception of logical space at each time (for each purpose): our attitude towards 'just is'-sentences is often one of uncertainty. For example, at many points in the history of chemistry there were numerous claims of the form ‘To be (stuff-name) is to be (chemical formula)’ concerning which we were uncertain, since the relevant experiments had not yet been done.

One might suggest that when a speaker who is uncertain as between two conceptions of logical space utters a sentence that is true relative to one and false relative to the other, the utterance is neither true nor false. But this makes for an awful lot of gappiness. Suppose that before the relevant chemical experiments were performed, we were uncertain as between (9) and (10). Since the conjunction of (11) and (12) is false relative to any conception on which (10) is true (and classical logic holds), the present proposal requires saying that if we had uttered this conjunction, we would not have spoken truly. This is implausible. Indeed, we could intuitively have spoken truly in uttering (11) and (12) even if we had, through shoddy experimental work, come to accept (10). Rayo could avoid such results by adopting a more 'externalistic' view, in which chemists' utterances 'presupposed' a conception on which (9) is true even when they did not actually accept (9). But this would undermine Rayo's reason for denying that the standard for correctness that applies to ordinary utterances applies to utterances of 'just is'-sentences. For if it can be opaque to speakers which conception they are presupposing, the goal of producing utterances that are true relative to the conceptions they presuppose is no more trivial for 'just is'-sentences than for ordinary sentences.

* * * * *

I have pulled out several arguments for Trivialist Platonism from Rayo's richly layered discussion, and shown how they might be resisted. But as Rayo is well aware, in metaphysics the most important work is often done, not in arguing for a claim or defending it against objections, but simply in getting it onto the table in such a way that we can understand it and appreciate its appeal. And in this respect, The Construction of Logical Space makes a very important contribution. NUMBERS and the other claims listed at the beginning of this review strike me as not only intelligible, but as adding up to an attractively strong and simple metaphysical vision, even without any of Rayo's further commitments (such as his Stalnakerian view of belief and knowledge and his conception-relative view of truth). This vision is not new — arguably most Platonists have held it — but Rayo’s emphasis on the importance of 'just is'-sentences is new and salutary. Rayo makes a persuasive case that claims like NUMBERS have a central role to play in metaphysical debates. I hope his clear and forceful articulation of these claims will help to restore them to their rightful place.[4]

[1] So, e.g., 'For a to be F just is for b to be G' will entail 'a=b' and 'To be F just is to be G'.

[2]  Those who think that it is contingent what objects there are may reject (4), on the grounds that there could be stars none of which actually exists, so nothing is such that, at the relevant world, it is a star.  In Chapter 6, Rayo develops a response to this objection, involving a conception of possible worlds in the spirit of what Lewis called ‘linguisticersatzism’.

[3]  One might invoke indeterminacy to avoid the need for choice in such cases. But this raises the prospect that we could revive a non-pragmatic notion of correctness in indeterminacy-theoretic terms. Those who accept the dualistic conception will presumably not think that (6) is indeterminate relative to it. So the dispute about whether this conception leads to pervasive indeterminacy might serve as a surrogate for the rejected dispute about its objective correctness.

[4]  Thanks to Peter Fritz, Jeremy Goodman, and Jessica Moss, to the participants in the NYU workshop on 'Logical and Modal Space', and especially to Agustín Rayo for his comments at that workshop on an earlier version of this review.