The Continuum Companion to Leibniz

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Brandon C. Look, The Continuum Companion to Leibniz, Continuum, 2011, 334pp., $190.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826429759.

Reviewed by Mogens Lærke, École Normale Supérieure de Lyon / University of Aberdeen


The Continuum Companion to Leibniz is conceived as an "accessible and authoritative reference guide to Leibniz's life, work, and legacy." The book is divided into three parts and contains seventeen chapters by fifteen authors. The first part, "Leibniz's Times and Philosophical Precursors," contains five contributions. The first, "Leibniz's Life and Works," is a fairly elaborate biographical account written by the general editor, Brandon Look, placing Leibniz in his historical context. It is followed by four articles dedicated to Leibniz's personal and philosophical relations to four other major thinkers of the period: Pauline Phemister writes on Leibniz and Descartes, Philip Beeley on Leibniz and Hobbes, Ursula Goldenbaum on Leibniz and Spinoza, and Sean Greenberg on Leibniz and Malebranche. The second part contains eleven articles dedicated to different areas of Leibniz's philosophy: Metaphysics (Look); Logical Theory (Samuel Levey); Theory of Cognition (Martha Brandt Bolton); Theory of Modality (Ohad Nachtomy); Theory of Causation (Look); Philosophical Theology (Martin Lin); Free Will (Jack Davidson); Moral Philosophy (Gregory Brown); Natural Philosophy (François Duchesneau); Life Sciences (Justin E. H. Smith); and Leibnizian Mathematics (Douglas M. Jesseph). The third part, which counts only one contribution, written by Anja Jauernig, is concerned with the reception of Leibniz's philosophy, mainly in Germany and with special emphasis on Kant. The volume finally contains a very rich bibliography which testifies to the extraordinary level of internationalization of contemporary Leibniz scholarship. It is a helpful guide not only to the available Anglo-American commentary, but also to the best literature written by French, German, and Italian scholars. On the whole, the volume is of exceptional quality. Each and every article represents an exciting, insightful and supremely qualified contribution to current discussions and the volume would very soon occupy a place of honor on the book shelves of a great many early modern philosophy scholars if it wasn't so insanely expensive. Instead, we must try and beat each other in the race to the nearest library holding a copy.

My only reservations are of a structural nature. The volume would have benefited from a short introduction explaining the basic editorial principles governing its layout. From the way in which the volume is organized it is however possible to deduce some of these principles. Each contribution in the lengthy second part provides a high quality introduction to one of eleven preset themes that more or less correspond to a standard list of key topics in Leibniz studies today. Adopting such a structure is a judicious choice from a pedagogical point of view, making it easier for newcomers to orient themselves in Leibniz's philosophy in correlation with the available commentary. From the scholarly point of view, however, it is not unproblematic.

The design of the volume clearly shows that historians of philosophy no longer limit themselves to study Leibniz's texts on topics that we today recognize as philosophical per se, such as logic, modal theory or metaphysics. Hence, there are a fair number of articles that from a contemporary viewpoint should be classified as studies in the history of science (e.g., texts on mechanical physics, life sciences, and mathematics). This is a good thing. It does honor to a contextualist insight, which is today fairly well-entrenched, concerning the way in which the seventeenth-century philosophical landscape was generally shaped, i.e., the fact that "philosophy" did not mean the same thing then as it does now. It also reflects the way in which Leibniz himself thought about his philosophical enterprise, which was, as Look concludes in his biographical sketch, "incredibly sweeping in scope" (p. 14). Indeed, for Leibniz, this polymath of polymaths, being a philosopher was not so much about studying a particular subject-matter, i.e., philosophy, but rather a question of studying any subject-matter en philosophe (something which incidentally explains why Leibniz's contributions to an astounding number of disciplines -- ranging from insurance science to revealed theology -- in no way affects his identity as a seventeenth-century philosopher).

The Companion does a good job of conveying the thematic breadth which results from Leibniz's practical conception of the philosophical enterprise. It is less clear, however, that the thematic distinctions used to map out this broad field do similar honor to Leibniz's own conception of his intellectual project. In fact, Leibniz's texts tend to resist the classification of topics imposed by the headings of the eleven contributions in the Companion. It is, for example, not at all clear that it makes good sense to treat Leibniz's "philosophical theology" separately from his "moral philosophy," or his "natural philosophy" separately from his "theory of causation," or that "metaphysics" can genuinely be treated as a topic separate from any of the preceding ones. Conversely, it is not clear to me that one can treat Leibniz's "philosophical theology" as one single topic, rather than having one contribution on natural theology (often identified with "metaphysics" by Leibniz, not with "philosophy" as Martin Lin suggests), and another on the elaborate epistemology of revealed matters that Leibniz develops, among other places, in the "Preliminary Discourse" of the Theodicy. In the Companion, the result is that Leibniz's entire treatment of revealed theology is simply ignored, thus leaving the reader with only half the story about his philosophical engagement with issues of theology (those interested in the other half may consult Maria-Rosa Antognazza's splendid Leibniz on the Trinity and the Incarnation (2007).

One way of dealing with problems of this kind would have been to structure the volume according to standard seventeenth century rather than twenty-first century classifications of philosophical topics, thus adopting a model of the kind proposed by Daniel Garber and Michael Ayers in their Cambridge History of Seventeenth-Century Philosophy (1998), where they intended to "structure the collection [corresponding] to one way, at any rate, in which an Educated European of the seventeenth century might have organized the domain of philosophy" (Introduction, p. 2). Arguably, Duchesneau's chapter on "Natural Philosophy" and Justin Smith's paper on "The Life Sciences" go in that direction, but there is no structured attempt to do that in the volume as a whole.

Another, more original option would be to take into account Leibniz's own suggestions for classifying the sciences in his Encyclopedia universalis, on the reasonable assumption that he in his philosophical practice would respect his own theoretical distinctions. Now, according to Leibniz's 1679 Project of a New Encyclopedia, the sciences should be theoretically divided into sixteen categories, namely Rational Grammar; Logic; Mnemonic Art; Topic; the Art of Formulae (dealing with "the same and the different, the similar and dissimilar"); Logistics (roughly what we today call mereology); Arithmetic; Geometry; Mechanics; Poeographia (the science of the sensible); Homeographia (the science of substances); Cosmography (the science of greater bodies); Idographia (the science of organic bodies); Moral Science; Geopolitics; and Natural Theology. Clearly, this classification reveals a way of ordering philosophical and scientific knowledge that is markedly different from what we would expect from a philosopher today. In any case, it does not bear even a remote resemblance to the classification into eleven topics we find in the Companion. No wonder then that problems arise.

Yet a third way of dealing with the problem is to take the alternative approach of which we find some samples in the first part of the book, namely avoiding the thematic blocks altogether and instead exploring Leibniz's relationship to other philosophers (in this case Descartes, Hobbes, Spinoza, and Malebranche.) As Look notes, the governing assumption behind this part is the fundamental contextualist credo that "Leibniz should be understood in terms of his relations to other philosophers, for much of his work is a reaction to important issues that were debated in his life" (p. 14). To my mind, these accounts of Leibniz's direct or indirect exchanges with other philosophers yield philosophical stories that complement each other in a much more seamless and fluent fashion than those in the part structured according to topics. Leibniz's views are presented and organized in accordance with the philosophical discussions in which he was engaged, thus actively taking into account "the climate [within which] Leibniz sought to situate his own thought," as Phemister puts it (p. 17). The result is some fascinating narratives about Leibniz in the process of "philosophizing" which provide a deeper understanding of his philosophical motivations than any static image of his "philosophy" will ever yield.

What is also remarkable about the articles in the first part is that none of the authors gives in to the temptation to develop comparative analyses of the kind still popular only a few decades ago, by simply juxtaposing allegedly monolithic philosophical "systems" (a representative example of this, although not in English, is Yvon Belaval's influential Leibniz critique de Descartes from 1960). Instead they engage in unraveling the complex dynamics of Leibniz's actual readings of, and exchanges with, the philosophers in question (including the intellectual strategies, the misunderstandings, the creative appropriations, etc.) Picking out Descartes, Hobbes, Spinoza, and Malebranche as the four privileged interlocutors does however reveal some remaining commitment to the age-old model according to which the history of philosophy should be written in terms of confrontations between canonized "great" philosophers. I am fairly certain, however, that this is not how it looked on the ground in Leibniz's philosophical laboratory. There are of course a number of other major philosophical figures with whom Leibniz had prolonged and important exchanges that one could wonder might merit an article (e.g., those with Arnauld or with Bayle.) This however is not the real concern. Hard choices will always have to be made. It is rather the underlying presupposition of the choice of controversies actually made, namely that Leibniz's most interesting or philosophically fruitful exchanges were necessarily those he had with major thinkers. Anyone who spends some time in Leibniz's texts will realize that much philosophical groundwork is laid down in exchanges with figures of lesser stature. The exchanges with Jacob Thomasius, Simon Foucher, or Burchard de Volder come to mind, but there are others -- indeed, Look is himself the translator and editor of a wonderful edition of The Leibniz-Des Bosses Correspondence (2007), which may serve as yet a fourth example.

The final section contains a valuable article by Jauernig guiding the reader through the complex intellectual landscape of eighteenth-century Germany, providing a precise image of the kind of Leibnizianism Kant inherited and reacted against in the critical philosophy. It was a wise editorial decision to include a section on the transmission and reception of Leibniz's philosophy -- a decision which runs counter to an unfortunate tendency in other companion series to omit contributions of this kind. It is regrettable, however, that a section on the "aftermath" of Leibniz's philosophy ends up giving an unsuspecting reader the impression that Leibniz reception in the eighteenth century was an exclusively German affair. Without denying the importance of studying the reception of Leibniz in any number of different national contexts, a chapter dedicated especially to the very rich but also very complicated French reception of Leibniz from Fontenelle to Diderot would have been a good addition to the volume, especially since this is a largely understudied area (W. H. Barber's Leibniz in France from Arnauld to Voltaire (1955) remains a valuable study, but clearly needs to be updated).

The manner in which The Continuum Companion to Leibniz  is structured faithfully reflects the current state of Anglo-American Leibniz scholarship. It provides a fairly exact image of how scholars today divide the labor of commentary between them in terms of topics, problems, and areas of study. I have taken this review of Look's Companion as an occasion to express some reservations about this division of labor and about the ways in which commentators habitually map out Leibniz's philosophy as whole, point to some of the problems it involves, and also suggest some of the ways in which these problems might be alleviated. It is of course easy and in some respects unfair to make suggestions about how a book could have been improved by being another book written on other basic editorial premises. If I nonetheless have taken this route, this should be taken as an (admittedly a bit backhanded) recognition of the fact that, if one accepts the unspoken principles upon which the volume has been edited, there is very little or nothing to complain about: The Continuum Companion to Leibniz is in many respects a splendid achievement. Moreover, my reservations concerning the overall structure and organization of the volume should not in any way overshadow the fact that the individual contributions are of an exceptional quality. The volume testifies to the immense progress in Leibniz scholarship achieved by Anglo-American historians of philosophy in the last decades. While most contributions undoubtedly will prove too advanced for undergraduate students, the book is an excellent resource for graduate students and professional philosophers wishing to acquire an idea of what top Leibniz research looks like today.