The Continuum Companion to Spinoza

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Wiep van Bunge, Henri Krop, Piet Steenbakkers, Jeroen van de Ven (eds.), The Continuum Companion to Spinoza, Continuum, 2011, 380pp., $190.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826418609.

Reviewed by Yitzhak Melamed, Johns Hopkins University


In a memorable, frequently quoted -- and misquoted -- passage in his Theological Political Treatise (1670), Spinoza claims that, if not for the womanish nature of the Jews, he would have believed that "since all things are changeable, the Jews might reestablish their state" (G III/57). Spinoza's concept of history is rather chaotic. While all things happen by necessity, Spinoza's history has no telos or direction. What seems to us virtually impossible today may well become real tomorrow under the appropriate circumstances. One should not assume the future stability of what appears unshaken today. Indeed, twenty or thirty years ago one could hardly believe that Spinoza's metaphysics would ever become a major source of debate and inspiration among analytic philosophers, but "all things are changeable." The current interest in and research on Spinoza in North American universities seems, at this point, to surpass that of almost any other early modern philosopher (with the possible exception of Hume). There are several reasons for this radical change, not the least of which is the re-emergence of metaphysics as a respectable, central discipline of philosophy. Spinoza's lot seems to be closely tied to that of metaphysics. When it flourishes, so does he. When it is crippled, Spinoza's specter must revert to his grave.

The volume under review appears at an interesting point in the development of Spinoza studies. The final part of the book provides a helpful essay on the history of Spinoza scholarship. The author of the essay, Wiep van Bunge, notes that during the past four decades, Paris served as the "unofficial capital of Spinoza scholarship." While this characterization was undoubtedly apt two or three years ago (when the essay was most probably written), today it seems dated. Recent and approaching retirements of many senior Spinoza scholars on the French scene seem to suggest that we are currently in a period of transition. While there is still a huge interest in Spinoza in France among advanced students and the public, the future institutional grounding of French Spinozism is unclear. Indeed, for all I can tell, current French Spinozism seems to be eclipsed by the emergence of Spinoza as a major figure of interest and stimulation on the other side of the Atlantic. Whether the new "unofficial capital of Spinoza scholarship" is New York, New Haven, or any other American city is not yet clear, but the rumor is that Spinoza's specter has been spotted above the Atlantic, westward bound.

The current volume, edited by four Dutch scholars, provides a helpful summary of the achievements of four decades of European Spinoza scholarship, with some emphasis on the work of scholars from the Low Countries. The structure of the volume is unique in comparison with other books of the "companion" genre. Instead of the regular eight to ten essays on the main aspects of the philosopher's thought, the current volume is structured more like a dictionary, framed by various introductory essays. The book consists of six divisions, each of which is accompanied by its own bibliography. The first division tells the story of Spinoza's life through a documentary history, presented more as a diary or chronicle than a narrative essay. This is a fresh, detailed, and very helpful unit.

The next division, edited by Piet Steenbakkers, surveys the influences on Spinoza's thought. It consists of five short essays on Francko Burgersdijck, Descartes, Franciscus van den Enden, Adriaan Heereboord, and "Jewish Philosophical Influences." It is not clear to me why discussion of all six Jewish philosophers -- many of whom lived four of five centuries apart -- should be piled up in one essay.

The third division of the book is allocated to early critiques of Spinoza. The idea of having such a unit is superb, but, unfortunately, most of the sources the editors chose (Bayle, Clarke, More, and Toland) are well known, and almost all are already available in English, the only exception being the newly translated excerpt from Christoph Wittich's 1690 book, Anti-Spinoza sive Examen Ethices Benedicti de Spinoza. Given the superb linguistic and philological capacities of the editors, one would have hoped for a more substantial contribution of newly translated sources from Dutch (or even Latin).

The fourth division is a detailed glossary of Spinozistic terms, edited by Henri Krop, who also contributed several splendid entries. The glossary is the centerpiece of the book, and its most important contribution. Though the quality of the entries (written by two dozen scholars) naturally varies, overall it is an extremely helpful and substantial research tool. The editor of this division made two crucial, praiseworthy decisions. First, the entries are listed in Latin (e.g., "Acquiescentia in se ipso" rather than "self-esteem" or "self-satisfaction"), thus avoiding some of the confusion that can result from translations. Second, the editor includes entries on several terms that are clearly crucial for understanding Spinoza's philosophy, yet had escaped scholarly scrutiny because they were not deemed "technical" terms, having precise meaning. For example, 'involvere' is commonly translated through the English cognate 'involves', and appears to be a non-technical colloquial term, yet Spinoza seems to use it in a very precise manner, and understanding the meaning of this term is crucial for understanding Spinoza's concepts of substance, essence, existence, and cause-of-itself (i.e., it is critical for understanding the very core of Spinoza's metaphysics). Other such terms include: 'quatenus' and 'ordo et connexio'. Obviously, one could have qualms about the exclusions of various terms (I would expect to have an entry on 'exprimere' (to express), a crucial and enigmatic term to which Deleuze dedicated a thick volume without ever explaining its basic meaning), but these complaints are beside the point, since the material offered in this glossary is substantial and goes quite a long way in helping the reader tackle Spinoza's difficult works.

The book's fifth division provides short synopses of Spinoza's works, their history, and the main philological literature on each. The sixth and final division is, as mentioned above, a short essay by van Bunge on the history of Spinoza scholarship. The essay is clear and helpful. It is written from a European perspective, and to my mind does not do justice to current American analytic scholarship on Spinoza. But let us not forget Hegel's old dictum: "The Owl of Minerva flies only at dusk." This is a fine volume summarizing one epoch in Spinoza scholarship. A new epoch is on the rise.