The Death of God and The Meaning of Life

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Young, Julian, The Death of God and The Meaning of Life, Routledge, 2003, 248pp, $25.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415307902.

Reviewed by Thomas Baldwin, University of York


Julian Young is the author of some excellent books on Schopenhauer, Nietzsche and Heidegger. In this book he returns to themes from these German philosophers, but now in the context of a broader attempt (as his title indicates) to suggest how life can be worth living even after the death of God. The book is organised as a narrative: Part I (’Before the death of God’) is a discussion of some of the ways in which philosophers have offered accounts of the meaning of human life in the context of a conception of a ’true world’ distinct from the everyday world. The basic idea is that the sufferings and injustices of ordinary life are to be punished or redeemed through some ultimate valuation of human conduct in the true world (a last judgment). In Part II (’After the death of God’) Young turns to the philosophers who lack faith in any such true world; for them, the challenge is one of showing how it remains possible for life to have a meaning when it is not a contribution to some grander metaphysical story.

Young’s topic is potentially all-encompassing and his treatment is therefore necessarily highly selective. Not surprisingly his main emphasis falls on the work of German philosophers. Of his fifteen chapters, nine are devoted to discussions of Germans (Kant, Hegel, Marx, Schopenhauer, Nietzsche (3), Heidegger (2)); French philosophers are allotted five chapters (Camus, Sartre (2), Foucault, Derrida); and the book starts with a chapter about Plato’s Phaedrus. So British and American philosophers such as Hume and James receive no attention; nor does Kierkegaard or any serious Christian philosopher. These omissions are a pity, but since much of the book concerns a reasonably unified debate, Young’s selective attention is defensible (though one could of course make a case for the inclusion of others, such as Kafka or Levinas). What is nonetheless a bit odd is the way in which Young has chosen to organise the debate: for example, the book ends with a chapter about Heidegger’s later philosophy which occurs after chapters about Foucault and Derrida, both of whom advert to Heidegger’s later philosophy. As we shall see below, however, there is a reason for this re-ordering of the dialectic.

In Part I Young begins from an exposition of Plato’s discussion in the Phaedrus of the soul’s relationship to the world of forms. This provides Young with a paradigm ’true world’ account of human life; furthermore Plato’s emphasis here on beauty as a way in which the forms become manifest within the everyday world prefigures Young’s subsequent emphasis on the importance of art to the possibility of living a meaningful life. Young then follows Nietzsche in asserting that Christianity is just a disguised form of Platonism and thus that he does not need to consider Christianity in any detail, either as a different type of ’true world’ philosophy or in order to assess the significance of the ’death of God’. It seems to me that this fails to do justice to the supposed significance of the life of Christ as developed in the doctrines of incarnation, atonement and resurrection, obscure though they are. Indeed many theologians have argued that the ’Platonisation’ of Christianity by St. Paul and others injected an alien metaphysical element into the religion which it does not need to have. If this is right, it follows that there will be forms of Christian faith, offering their own account of the meaning of life, which are largely unaffected by the metaphysical scepticism whose path Young traces. Kierkegaard’s works offer one prominent example of the possibility of a faith of this kind and Simone Weil provides another example. But it does not follow that Young’s discussion of the ’God of the philosophers’ and of the significance of his death is unimportant; for there is no doubt that this has been an important strand of Western culture and for those who are not attracted by religion, the question of the possibility of finding a non-religious meaning for life is of inescapable importance.

Young jumps from Plato all the way to Kant in order to discuss the way in which philosophers began to deal with the challenge to traditional faith posed by the rise of the natural sciences and the Enlightenment. It is a bit startling that Young provides no discussion at all of the French Encyclopédistes and of Hume, but one has to accept that Young’s interest lies primarily in discussing the German debate. Young notes that Kant takes it that religion has to find its vindication through its connection with morality, but he does not pursue the important questions as to what conception of morality is presupposed here and what connection between morality and human motivation Kant supposes there to be (he does not discuss Kant’s Religion within theLlimits of Reason Alone, in which Kant attempts to deal with these issues). Instead Kant seems to be introduced primarily as a way of setting the scene for Schopenhauer, whose pessimism and ’European Buddhism’ are discussed sympathetically. Young is very good at elucidating Schopenhauer’s long discussions of the will and at criticising his abstract arguments for pessimism, though he firmly endorses Schopenhauer’s rejection of traditional theodicies. Young also argues that Schopenhauer’s positive recommendation that one should renounce individual striving itself rests on ’true world’ philosophy which offers the hope of salvation through unification with a universal will that is the true world, though he comments that this supposed method of salvation is puzzling since Schopenhauer also holds that the will is the source of all evil; and I would add that it is unclear how renunciation can be a way of affirming the ultimate reality of the will.

The young Nietzsche of The Birth of Tragedy is then ushered in as offering a coherent version of what is essentially Schopenhauer’s position; the importance of Greek tragedy is that it enables the audience to lose their sense of their own individuality and to gain an intimation of the possibility of salvation through unification with others and the world in Dionysiac acts that are not evil but ’beyond good and evil’. This is still a ’true world’ story; but for Young, the crucial break comes when Nietzsche moves on to announce ’the death of God’ in The Gay Science, no longer advocating the renunciation of individuality, but himself renouncing the prospect of any true world which provides a kind of salvation that is not to be found in the ordinary everyday world, which is the only world there is. Before he gets to this, however, Young turns back the clock to discuss Hegel and (very briefly) Marx. They come after the early Nietzsche in Young’s discussion because, according to Young, they do not belong in the tradition of post-Kantian idealism: Hegel’s objective idealism is said to be a realist doctrine (surely it would be better to represent Hegel as rejecting the idealism/realism contrast). Young then embarks on a brisk exposition of some central themes from Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit and explains that, despite his rejection of Kant’s noumenal world, Hegel counts as a ’true world’ philosopher because of his faith in the utopian rationality of history; and the familiar criticism of this is then that we have overwhelming reason to abandon any such faith (Marxism is briefly criticised for the same reason). This is indeed fair enough; but although Young discusses the master/slave dialectic sensitively there is so much more of interest in the social and ethical philosophy of Hegel and Marx which bears on Young’s main theme that, as with his discussion of Kant, I was left in the end with the sense of an opportunity lost.

Young starts Part II of his book with Nietzsche’s announcement of the ’death of God’ and he then turns to the issue of whether the philosophical tradition he is exploring offers a way of giving meaning to one’s life without the promise of redemption in another world. Unfortunately Young does not take time to examine the presuppositions of this issue; for example, why is it not enough to say ’Do good and abjure evil’? Sometimes it seems as though we are supposed to be worrying about the epistemological grounds of morality; at other times to be asking why we should care about morality. As it is we get a rather breathless survey of some suggestions by German philosophers and their alleged French disciples. Young begins, however, with two excellent chapters on Nietzsche. In the first (’Later Nietzsche’) he sets out what he takes to be the positive thesis of The Gay Science, namely that we should seek to lead our lives as works of art. Young then raises two challenges for this account, both arising from what he takes to be Nietzsche’s emphasis on the will: first, how does my choice of a life connect with morality? Is any life that is suitably aesthetic a life worth living? Second, if my construction of myself is a matter of choice, are these choices constrained at all by my commitments and responsibilities? Or is the specification of these commitments and responsibilities dependent upon my choices? These set much of the agenda for much of the subsequent discussion. But before we get to this Young adds a further chapter on Nietzsche (’Posthumous Nietzsche’) in which he roundly criticises Heidegger’s claim that Nietzsche’s unpublished writings show that his fundamental doctrine was a metaphysical affirmation of the ultimate reality of ’the will to power’.

Young is, however, much more sympathetic to Heidegger’s own positive philosophy. The ’early’ Heidegger of Being and Time gives us an account of ’authenticity’ which builds on Nietzsche’s position but, according to Young, takes matters further by emphasising that the task of achieving authenticity can be accomplished only by taking account of the values inherent in one’s own historical context (one’s ’heritage’). The issue that Young raises here, as to how far the achievement of authenticity is a matter of self-discovery as opposed to choice of oneself, is both interesting and difficult. I disagree with Young’s claim that for Heidegger it is fundamentally a matter of self-discovery, for this conflicts with Heidegger’s basic characterisation of Dasein as that whose ’essence’ lies in its ’existence’. What is needed here is something that stands between arbitrary choice and discovery of a true self, though it is not easy to characterise this - Heidegger himself seems to me both suggestive and elusive on this issue. A different, and more troubling, issue which Young does not raise is that of whether Heidegger’s valuation of authenticity is not a further variant of the ’true world’ philosophy that was supposed to have been buried at this stage of the dialectic, with a ’true self’ standing in for the ’true world’. After all, in abandoning the ’true world’ hypothesis we accept that this everyday world is the only world there is; similarly, then, should we not also accept that our ordinary everyday existence is the only kind of life available to us, and that denigrating it as ’inauthentic’ by the standards of some higher existence is just as pernicious as the old habit of denigrating the everyday world by the standards of some abstract perfect world? It seems to me that there is no more reason to have faith in authenticity than in the true world ideals which Young dismisses.

Young now introduces the French contribution to his debate, starting with two chapters about Sartre. He gives Sartre two chapters because he finds two different, and conflicting, lines of thought in Being and Nothingness: according to the first, our lives are ’absurd’ (=meaningless) because the ’original’ choice through which we choose the kind of person to be is necessarily a choice made for no reason, since in choosing ourselves we choose our values; whereas according to the second line of thought, our choice of ourself is absurd (= futile) because it is informed by the impossible ideal of becoming a perfect God-like person. Young argues that this second line of thought is unwarranted, though it includes an important insight concerning our dependence upon others; but he allows that the first line of thought is a way of expressing the stark challenge which arises from the death of God, conceived as the denial that values are facts either within the familiar world or in some other world. It seems to me, however, that Young misrepresents Sartre here, in that the lines of thought he separates in his two chapters are actually intertwined. In brief, the second line of thought motivates the first: Sartre holds that any choice we make of ourselves is necessarily informed by an ideal; but, he argues, if the ideal is specified in terms of a realist conception of value (a ’true world’), it cannot be fulfilled; hence, in recognising this, we may well be drawn to the conclusion that our lives are meaningless. What is much more serious than this misrepresentation of Sartre’s position, however, is that Young altogether fails to discuss Sartre’s own conception of authenticity (’pure reflection’) and the ’conversion’ whereby he envisages that it is after all possible to have a life worth living. Admittedly this is not discussed in Being and Nothingness, though its possibility is explicitly hinted at there; but it is discussed at great length in Sartre’s posthumous Notebooks for an Ethics from 1947-8. This material connects closely with Sartre’s growing enthusiasm for socialism which Young also passes over, with the result that Sartre’s positive contribution to the debate Young is discussing never gets aired, and it is important to note this omission not simply to set the record straight on behalf of Sartre, but also because Sartre’s proposal for giving meaning to one’s life by contributing to a collective enterprise of social liberation is never properly addressed by Young.

After Sartre, Young moves on to Camus, whose individualist perspective he finds more congenial; he nonetheless, and surely rightly, rejects the exclusive emphasis on the joys of present experience that Camus sometimes (though certainly not always) seems to endorse. There then follow chapters on Foucault and Derrida. Although there are some good observations here, for example on the close relationship between Foucault’s ’normalisation’ and Heidegger’s Das Man, I think these two chapters are misguided in that both Foucault and Derrida would want to question the presuppositions of Young’s ’German’ debate about the possibility that life has a ’meaning’. Foucault, who of course proclaims that the death of God brings with it the death of ’man’, would argue that Young’s question has ’humanist’ presuppositions that need to be set aside through a ’genealogical’ critique. Derrida, in turn, would want to deconstruct the terms of the debate, while allowing that life must have some kind of meaning insofar as the work of differance is sustained. It is also striking that Young does not discuss the texts in which Foucault and Derrida come closest to his question – in Foucault’s case, his last writings on sexuality, and in Derrida’s case, his ethical writings such as The Gift of Death. So although Young judges that neither Foucault nor Derrida make any contribution to his debate, I think that on a more sympathetic and reflective reading they would be found to offer lines of argument which suggest that the issues are not best conceived as he takes them to be.

But in the final chapter Young moves back onto ground with which he is much more familiar, Heidegger’s later philosophy. Young’s reason for reorganising history in this way is that he takes it that Heidegger does here offer a way of finding meaning in our lives after the death of God which is not just a matter of adopting an arbitrary personal project which one can reject at any moment. Heidegger’s message for us is that we should be ’guardians’ of the world, in the sense of recognising and caring for the aspects of things which are ’holy’ and thus merit ’respect and reverence’ – which, for Young appear to be primarily the natural flora and fauna of wooded hillsides and suchlike. Young seems content to take over Heidegger’s obscure language of Being, but the substance of the position seems to be just an affirmation of a theory of intrinsic value combined with a strongly ethical conception of the self – it is our ’essence’ to be guardians. But if that is the answer to Young’s quest then it is unclear to me why we have had to pursue such a tortuous path to it and also what reason we have to believe in it. I am not, in fact, unsympathetic to it; values are here in our world and we find meaning in our lives by recognising and working with them. But if this position is to be vindicated, it needs to be set out and worked through in a language with which we are at home.