The Death of the Animal: A Dialogue

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Paola Cavalieri (ed.), The Death of the Animal: A Dialogue, Columbia UP, 2009, 149pp., $19.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780231145527.

Reviewed by Clare Palmer, Washington University in St Louis



The Death of the Animal is an imaginatively structured and thought-provoking addition to the growing Columbia University Press series in animal studies. It brings together — and into dialogue — a number of prominent scholars in the field: the book is introduced by Peter Singer; the anchoring chapter is by Paola Cavalieri; while Cary Wolfe, Matthew Calarco, John Coetzee and Harlan Miller contribute the other essays. The volume continues the trend in animal studies toward the publication of edited collections — for instance Killing Animals (Illinois UP, 2006) and Philosophy and Animal Life (Columbia UP, 2007) — in which the authors explicitly respond to one another’s contributions, creating an ongoing conversation rather than a series of stand-alone papers.

Cavalieri’s opening chapter, the stimulus for the discussion, is written in the form of a Socratic dialogue between two fictional characters, Alexandra Warnock (from the “analytic” philosophical tradition) and Theo Glucksmann (from the “Continental” philosophical tradition). The key theme of the dialogue is the moral status of animals, but (unsurprisingly, given the way the dialogue is set up) questions about the way in which philosophy should be pursued are never far from the surface.

Alexandra, who takes the leading role in the dialogue, is primarily concerned to reject what she calls ethical “perfectionism”: the idea that, because one being has — or is perceived to have — certain characteristics, it is of greater value than a being that lacks these characteristics. This idea, she suggests is “the legacy of atavisms that a perfected ethics can no longer accept” (p.3). The idea of “the animal” has, she argues, been the anchoring concept behind this wrong-headed perfectionism. “The animal” is characterized by the absence of key characteristics attributed to “the human”, primarily the cognitive characteristics of self-consciousness, rationality and conceptual-linguistic ability. In various past cultures, some humans (such as women or slaves) were thought to lack these capacities or to possess them in lesser degree, and on this basis they were assigned lower moral status. These judgments were empirically incorrect. Whether or not they were empirically correct, however, is irrelevant to moral status. A human being is not of lesser value because he or she lacks conceptual-linguistic ability or any other cognitive capacity. Further, Alexandra argues, this view is now very widely held; almost everyone defends the position that all human beings have full and equal moral status, whatever their cognitive ability. This is so even when, from the subjective perspective of the human involved, extreme suffering means that life is no longer worth living (p.28).

If this view is taken of the human case, she maintains, then it’s inconsistent not to apply it also to the animal case. If the lack of certain cognitive capacities doesn’t diminish human moral status, it shouldn’t be taken to diminish the moral status of animals either. For Alexandra, as long as a being is “intentional” and “has goals and wants to achieve them” the being should be regarded as a rights-holder, equal to all other beings that share such capacities (p.39). This fundamental equality is particularly important when thinking about the meaning of death: “Since death means the end of everything, dying is something categorical, which cannot involve greater or lesser degrees of harm” (p.32). Death is equally harmful for all intentional, subjective beings; the view that all or some human beings are of higher value than animals, and that killing them is worse than killing other beings, emerges from the outdated worldviews that have shaped and formed central Western metaphysical traditions (including, she maintains, important traditions in Continental philosophy). As Cavalieri explicitly argues later in the volume, ethics should be separated from metaphysical and religious worldviews, a separation that was once necessary for the development of modern science and is now necessary for the progress of ethics (p.95).

Alexandra’s claims (and I assume she is to be taken as representing Cavalieri’s position) are not new, though they are here brought together and framed in a novel way. In the context of Cavalieri’s dialogue itself, these claims receive little serious opposition. Theo, Alexandra’s interlocutor, barely challenges her. Her voice is dominant throughout; his interventions are mostly limited to clarifications, elaborations and agreements. (Given that he is apparently located in a Continental philosophical tradition, an obvious, symbolic implication for the relative positions of these philosophical traditions seems to follow. This may, rightly, trouble some readers.) To consider serious challenges to Alexandra’s view, we need to turn to the other contributors to the collection. Here we find diverse and substantial questions about, and objections to, the position she defends.

The first important question comes early on: Peter Singer, in the Introduction, asks, “should we grant to nonhuman animals a basic moral status equal to that of humans, or should we recognize gradations of moral status for humans?” (p.x). After all, while it would be inconsistent to judge that the absence of certain cognitive capacities diminishes the value of animals but not humans, the consistent conclusion need not be equality. As Singer (and a number of other philosophers, including Raymond Frey) have argued, we could alternatively take the view that some human lives are indeed worth more than others, or at least that killing harms some more than others. Alexandra vehemently rejects this position, maintaining that such perfectionist views underpinned the Nazi Aktion T4 program, a program that killed disabled humans lacking in important cognitive skills (p.35). The question, though, is whether weighing the possession of some cognitive abilities more heavily in moral decision-making must lead to anything like the Aktion T4 program. Presumably, it’s possible to argue for a much more moderate conclusion — that death is more of a harm to some humans (perhaps those with conscious hopes and plans for the future) than to others — without in any way having to endorse the killing of those for whom death is a lesser harm.

A second worry, briefly raised by Wolfe, is that Alexandra’s case depends on precisely the kinds of empirical arguments that she claims to be rejecting (p.46). This worry, I think, merits some development. Alexandra maintains that ethical claims based on a being’s cognitive level (such as its conceptual-linguistic ability) are mistaken, partly because such cognitive skills are irrelevant to moral status. Towards the end of the dialogue, however, Alexandra turns to human rights theory to provide the basis for an ethics that’s non-perfectionist in key respects. In human rights theory, “access to the sphere of moral rights” turns out to depend on “the fact of being an agent, that is, an intentional being that has goals and wants to achieve them” (p.39). Alexandra appears to accept that if this condition for rights-holding were consistently applied across species — that is, if it were regarded as the basis for all rights, not just human rights — then it could ground the kinds of protection for animals that she thinks is morally required. At first sight, however, this claim about intentionality also looks like a claim that bases moral status on some kind of cognitive ability, exactly the kind of claim that she rejects elsewhere. Perhaps there’s a sense in which intentionality could just mean the capacity for goal-directed behavior and could count as non-cognitive since it does not involve “exacting mental skills” (p.40). Then, however, I think we’re owed more of an explanation of what counts as a “cognitive endowment” and why intentionality should not be seen as such an endowment. Without such an explanation, what’s actually being claimed here remains puzzling.

Other objections in this volume to the position staked out by Alexandra are, in a sense, more fundamental, since in different ways they question the very rational form of the argument on which the dialogue depends. Wolfe, first, comments on the dialogic vehicle Cavalieri adopts in order to convey her argument. The use of a dialogue, he points out, raises questions about how far we are persuaded just by “the logical and propositional force of the argument” and how far by “linguistic and literary means”. This suggests, at least, that there’s more going on here than just a “self-sufficient and self-contained argument”. The use of dialogic form exemplifies, Wolfe suggests, Derrida’s “logic of the supplement” — the need to “complete a thing” (p.48). (Cavalieri, it should be noted, resists this characterization [p.93].) Drawing on Cora Diamond’s work, Wolfe also points out how an awareness — one that we may try to deflect or deny — of our own bodies’ vulnerability and mortality may lurk behind our response to what we do to animals’ bodies, exposing a reality that’s “not masterable by reason and the crafting of logical arguments” (p.48). Coetzee, in a related move, maintains that those contributing to this volume did not do so because they had once read a book that convinced them, intellectually, to change their thinking about animals, but rather because they had had a conversion experience — perhaps due to some animal’s “mute appeal” — for which they later tried to find rational support (p.89). Indeed, Coetzee suggests, our moral self may be “more deeply founded within us than rationality itself” so that a rational ethics follows from this deeper response, and is an attempt to articulate and give form to it (p.121). Calarco, while emphasizing that rational discourse should have a place in ethics, suggests that Cavalieri’s arguments are themselves “humanist, which is to say metaphysical” and therefore not independent of metaphysics, as she claims. Further, rational discourse is “but one tool at our disposal” with respect to reconsidering our practices towards animals. What we need, he suggests, is a “much larger, more thoroughgoing transformative project” (p.137).

A further key objection, made by several of the contributors, is — to use Wolfe’s words — that “Cavalieri’s way of rejecting perfectionism is itself a form of perfectionism” (p.125). This objection takes several forms. Coetzee suggests that the dialogue and its proponents themselves exemplify perfectionism in practice. Theo and Alexandra privilege the cool, bloodless, rational life of the mind, not the body of the sentient being; they are not, after all, out “brawling and guzzling and fucking”, but rather living the kind of intellectual life only available to the “upper intelligentsia”, and certainly not to non-human animals. Calarco, on the other hand, rejects Coetzee’s “performative” take on Theo and Alexandra’s perfectionism, arguing that the use of rational discourse needn’t have the kind of perfectionist implication that Coetzee attributes to it. However, Calarco suggests that the project Alexandra endorses manifests a “new perfectionism” in a different way. On this account, being an agent, having intentionality and subjectivity, endows beings with equal moral status. What, however, of those beings that lack such capacities; do they have lesser, or no moral status? Isn’t this just drawing the perfectionist ‘line in the sand’ in a new place? Calarco argues that the dialogue presents just another kind of hierarchy, “reliant on a problematic and exclusionary notion of subjectivity”, and constructing a rights theory that depends “on the idea of an inside and an outside, of members and non-members” (p.138).

Although I’ve focused primarily on aspects of Coetzee’s and Calarco’s responses to Cavalieri here, all the papers in this collection have something rich and interesting to offer. Wolfe’s reading of Derrida is sharp and engaging, while Harlan Miller — whose position is closest to Cavalieri’s — defends the significance of rational argument in ethics. He remains unconvinced, for instance, by Coetzee’s claim that changes of heart precede changes of mind. In his own case, he maintains, it was the rational arguments of Singer and other animal ethicists that convinced him to change his position on animals. Likewise, he maintains, rational arguments, rather than confrontation with victims, convinced people that slavery was an abomination (p.113).

As will have become evident from this discussion, although the formal subject matter of this volume is the “death of the animal”, there’s a lot more going on in it. At least as central is a debate about the place of reason in ethics, and about how successful and comprehensive the appeal to rationality and consistency in our interactions with others — including, but not limited to animals — should be thought to be. It’s in this debate, I think, that this collection really has something new and interesting to offer. For, I must confess, I found Cavalieri’s attempt to recreate a Greek dialogue in the modern world in itself unsatisfying. The discussion is stilted and unnatural, Alexandra is complacent and unlikeable, and Theo makes little impact at all. I found it impossible not to wish with Coetzee that they would go “brawling and guzzling and fucking” with one another — or anyone else for that matter — and actually enjoy their Greek beach. Nevertheless, as a launching pad for the lively discussion about reason in animal ethics that follows, Cavalieri’s dialogue serves perfectly. In a broader context, the work of Raymond Gaita, Cora Diamond, and of course John Coetzee himself in The Lives of Animals and Elizabeth Costello can be seen together as constituting a kind of challenge to the rational argumentation for animal rights/liberation that has dominated animal ethics. This volume brings together (for the first time, as far as I know) voices from differing perspectives in this important debate, and these intelligent contributions combine to create a coherent, sharp and engaging interaction. The essays raise central questions both about the place of the capacity to reason in our valuation of other beings and also about the role of reason in framing our ethical responsibilities towards other beings — and about the relation between these two questions. This makes the book critical reading for those working in animal ethics, and, more broadly, of serious interest to anyone following current debates in animal studies.