The Death of the Ethic of Life

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John Basl, The Death of the Ethic of Life, Oxford University Press, 2019, 207pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190923877.

Reviewed by Kent Dunnington, Biola University


Which beings have intrinsic moral value is a central question in environmental ethics. Four answers to the question are on offer. The narrowest answer, anthropocentrism, holds that humans are the only beings with intrinsic value. If anthropocentrism is true, then our decisions about how to treat non-human beings will be constrained only by considerations about how their treatment bears on human interests. The second answer, sentientism, broadens the range of intrinsic moral value to include all sentient beings. Peter Singer has famously and influentially argued for this view. The third answer, biocentrism, attributes intrinsic moral value to all living organisms, including nonsentient ones. The broadest answer, holism, extends the range of intrinsic moral value beyond living organisms to include certain collections of individuals, typically species and/or ecosystems.

The thesis of John Basl's book is that biocentrism is false. Basl argues that the "ethic of life," according to which all living organisms have intrinsic moral value and so must factor directly in our moral consideration, is indefensible. An implication of Basl's argument is that holism, too, is false. The book is concerned to undermine biocentrism (and holism), not to defend anthropocentrism or sentientism. Despite its critical ambitions, however, the book is highly constructive. Far from attacking a straw man of biocentrism, Basl develops the most rigorous account of biocentrism currently available.

The book has two parts. In Part I, "Foundations of Biocentrism," Basl develops a theoretical grounding for biocentrism. Biocentrists typically argue that all living beings possess moral status because all living beings possess a welfare. As evidence that nonsentient beings have a welfare, consider how we speak of them. We say that weed killer is bad for weeds but good for us. The natural way of interpreting a claim like this is that weed killer frustrates the welfare of weeds even if it promotes the welfare of (weed-hating) humans. If it makes sense to think of weeds having a welfare, biocentrists argue, then weeds are intrinsically morally valuable. The suppressed premise here, which Basl brings out, is that beings that have a welfare thereby gain moral status. Opponents of biocentrism typically grant the suppressed premise, but argue that nonsentient beings lack a welfare: even though we speak this way about weeds and other nonsentient organisms, we don't speak literally. Nonsentient organisms don't literally have a welfare; weeds don't have interests or ends and thus there is, strictly speaking, no way that weeds can be made better or worse off. Basl rejects this whole approach to undermining biocentrism. Part I is Basl's argument for the claim that non-sentient organisms do, in fact, have a welfare. In Part II, he argues that even though nonsentient beings have a welfare, they do not have direct moral status.

Basl begins Part I by examining three kinds of theories of welfare. Mind-only theories like hedonism hold that whether or not things go well for a being depends entirely on that being's conscious states. Mind-world theories like preference-satisfaction views hold that whether or not things go well for a being is a function of the relationship between a being's conscious states and the world. Finally, world-only theories, which Basl calls objective list views, hold that welfare is constituted entirely by facts about a being, including facts that have nothing to do with conscious states of that being. For example, Aristotle's view that one who has no true friends (even if she mistakenly thinks she has) lacks eudaimonia is an example of a world-only theory of welfare. If one of the first two kinds of theories of welfare is correct, biocentrism is dead on arrival since by definition it is committed to the welfare of beings who lack consciousness. Basl argues, however, that the biocentrist is in good shape here because there are many problems with mind-only or mind-world theories of welfare and good reasons to adopt an objective list view of welfare. The biocentrist must be committed to an objective list view of welfare, and the task for the biocentrist is to offer a compelling account of the objective welfare of nonsentient organisms.

Basl argues that the only way a biocentrist can explain how nonsentient organisms have an objective welfare is by appeal to the teleological ordering of those organisms. If a nonsentient organism has a telos, then it seems straightforwardly true that things go well for that organism just to the extent that its ends are realized. Basl notes that many have thought Darwin eradicated teleology, but that is not true. Instead, Darwin transformed our understanding of the source of teleology. Consider a heart that pumps blood and makes a thump-thump noise. We say it is the heart's telos to pump blood but not to go thump-thump. Why? Because the heart was selected to pump blood but not to go thump-thump. Put differently, even if the heart did not go thump-thump it would exist, but if the heart did not pump blood it would not exist. This is a story of the selection etiology of the heart, and the lesson is that something can have a telos in virtue of being selected for. Basl argues that the biocentrist can ground nonsentient organism welfare in just this way. Weeds have been naturally selected because they survive and reproduce. Their end is therefore to survive and reproduce and their welfare is either promoted or frustrated to the extent they are helped or hindered at surviving and reproducing.

Suppose you don't find this etiological account of the teleological welfare of nonsentient organisms plausible. Then, if Basl is right that this is the only available way to ground the welfare of nonsentient organisms, you should abandon the view that nonsentient organisms have a welfare and, consequently, abandon biocentrism. However, if you accept Basl's etiological account of teleological welfare to ground biocentrism's claim to the direct moral status of nonsentient organisms, you thereby commit yourself to the direct moral status of a host of entities that, Basl thinks, no one will want to accord direct moral status. This is the dilemma for the biocentrist.

Basl develops the second horn of the dilemma in Part II, "Artifacts, Ecosystems, and the Death of the Ethic of Life." He provides numerous examples of entities that appear to have as much of a claim to a teleological welfare as nonsentient organisms. For example, corkscrews and computers clearly have a telos for which they were selected, and therefore they have a welfare. But if they have a welfare, and if the biocentrist is right that beings with a welfare have direct moral status, then corkscrews and computers have direct moral status as well. The biocentrist might object that the telos of a corkscrew is artificially rather than naturally selected, but Basl rightly points out that this should not matter. After all, teleology is allegedly more, not less, evident when intentional design (rather than random selection) lies back of a being's teleological organization. If artificial selection could not ground teleology, then biocentrists would be in the odd position of insisting that if nonsentient organisms were designed by God for certain purposes they would have no teloi. But even if the biocentrist can deal with the problem that artificially selected artifacts appear to have a welfare (and therefore, apparently, direct moral status), problems remain. For example, Basl shows there is evidence that natural selection happens at the level of some groups of organisms, but rarely at the species level and never at the ecosystem level. If this is true, then biocentrists who defend a teleological account of welfare must include seemingly arbitrary groupings of organisms among those beings that have direct moral status, but must exclude species and ecosystems. This is Basl's indirect argument against holism; even if teleology can ground moral status, there is no good reason to think that species or ecosystems have a teleology.

So, the biocentrist's dilemma: either reject that nonsentient organisms have a welfare or accept that their welfare is grounded by features that will extend direct moral status to entities that far outstrip anything countenanced by biocentrism. Either way, biocentrism is in trouble. Because Basl believes that nonsentient beings, including artifacts, do have a welfare, he concludes that having a welfare does not entail having direct moral status. Nonsentient organisms, corkscrews, and certain groups of organisms all possess a welfare grounded by a selection etiology, but none of them possesses direct moral status.

Basl's arguments will be less conclusive against biocentrists who are not philosophical naturalists. For example, a theist who is also a biocentrist can avoid grounding the moral status of nonsentient beings in natural selection or artificial selection simpliciter. They can ground the moral status of nonsentient beings in divine selection. Perhaps a necessary condition for having a welfare is being divinely selected for some purpose. A theistic holist can make a similar move and ground the moral status of species and ecosystems in divine selection as well. However, biocentrists and holists who are committed to naturalism will be pressed by Basl's book to develop their position in new ways.

In the book's conclusion, Basl claims that if his argument is sound, biocentrists have four available responses. First, they can deny that the best form of biocentrism is one on which nonsentient beings are morally considerable. Second, they can deny that the welfare of nonsentient beings is best explained in terms of teleology. Third, they can deny that teleology should be grounded in selection etiologies. Fourth, they can find other arguments for maintaining the distinction between individual nonsentient organisms on the one hand and teleologically ordered artifacts and collectives on the other. I would add a fifth available strategy. Biocentrists might attempt to base the moral status of nonsentient beings on something other than their welfare. Perhaps having a welfare is not a necessary condition for having direct moral status. And, as I've suggested, there is a sixth strategy as well. Biocentrists who reject naturalism have theoretical resources to bypass Basl's arguments.

Basl's book is lucid and persuasive. His argument is easy to follow, and he treats the biocentrist position with admirable fairness. Biocentrists who read Basl's book will be better equipped to rethink and defend the biocentrist position, not only because his objections against biocentrism are so compelling but also because he clearly charts the live options for defending a naturalist biocentrist position. Basl's book is a commendable example of charitable philosophical work.