The Death Penalty, Volume I

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Jacques Derrida, The Death Penalty, Volume I, Geoffrey Bennington, Marc Crépon, and Thomas Dutoit (eds.), Peggy Kamuf (tr.), University of Chicago Press, 2014, 287pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226144320.

Reviewed by Björn Thorsteinsson, University of Iceland


Jacques Derrida's lectures on the death penalty were given at the École des hautes études en sciences sociales in Paris during the academic years 1999-2000 and 2000-2001. As explained in the Editorial Note to this English translation, they formed a part of Derrida's weekly seminar at the École, which ran for fourteen years under the general heading of "Questions of Responsibility". The last section of the seminar, dealing with issues of "The Beast and the Sovereign", has already been published in both French and English (and reviewed in this journal). The book under review here contains the first part of the section on the death penalty, with the second part scheduled to be published in French this year and in English in 2015.

Thus the publication of Derrida's seminars -- as well as the accompanying "Derrida Seminars Translation Project" -- proceeds at a steady pace, even if, as the editors readily acknowledge, Derrida's own opinion on the suitability of the lectures for publication remained ambiguous (ix, xi). In any case, Derrida's readers, whether appreciative or critical, will doubtless find the text of his seminars useful for different purposes.

It must be said, however, that the seminar on the death penalty will, to a large degree, be found somewhat unrewarding in this regard. In many of the sessions, Derrida spent considerable time reading lengthy passages from works by authors such as Beccaria, Genet, Badinter, Hugo, Camus, Blanchot, Kant and Nietzsche, often offering his listeners, and now his readers, little in the way of a detailed exegesis or explication, and rarely proceeding to flesh out possible relations with his own conceptual constellations, or with those of other thinkers. Accordingly, the reader is left with the feeling that considerable work remains to be done.

This, of course, should not be seen in an overly negative light. Indeed, Derrida made it eminently clear from the beginning that the last word on the enormous issue of the death penalty would not be spoken in the seminar. Readers of Derrida will be familiar with his (quite understandable) habit of deferring discussion of important issues to a later date; this refrain is abundantly present in the text of the seminars.

However all of that may be, it seems quite unavoidable to raise the question of the author's, and/or the teacher's, stand on the issue at stake: what, after all, do you want to tell us about the death penalty? At the outset of the lectures, Derrida provides a clear enough answer, stating that "my discourse is going to be abolitionist, obviously", but then he hastens to add that the declaration of this evident fact "will not prevent me from posing critical or deconstructive questions about the abolitionist discourse" (5n7). For, as he puts it, true to himself as the thinker who never shied away from tarrying with complexities, "we are not here to simplify" (27).

So it is that yet again, in the lectures on the death penalty, we find Derrida grappling with issues that seem all but impossible to handle, not least owing to their enormity. Bearing in mind his definition of deconstruction as experimenting with the impossible, we are told, here, that "Deconstruction, what is called by that name, is perhaps, perhaps the deconstruction of the death penalty, of the logocentric, logonomocentric scaffolding in which the death penalty is inscribed or prescribed." (23) Thus, we catch a glimpse of the way in which Derrida's philosophical endeavor sets out to reinvent philosophy, or, perhaps more appropriately, discover another philosophy and/or a new kind of writing which would, at long last, somehow, give abolitionism its due, render it justice and carve out for it its "properly philosophical place" (xv). Still, the matter turns out to be not that simple, for, as Derrida tells us, we are up against an uncanny interlocking of the extremes, which, in turn, leads to the following definition: "The impossible task of this seminar is this: to break this alliance, this symmetry between abolitionism and anti-abolitionism where finally each of them needs the other." (259n25) This, however, would require, and even necessitate, facing up to what must surely be the greatest impossibility of all, or, as Derrida somewhat jovially puts it:

hey, at bottom that's the dream of deconstruction, a convulsive moment to have done with death, to deconstruct death itself. Not to put into question again the question, what is death? when and where does it take place? etc. What comes afterward? and so forth. But to deconstruct death. Final period. And with the same blow, to come to blows with death and put it out of action. No less than that. Death to death. (240-241)

Such a description is bound to raise some eyebrows, or at least it has the potential to reinvigorate the recurring question of deconstruction's kinship with, or even subservience to, that irrepressible urge to do away with death, which we call technology. In that regard, however, it must be pointed out, as Derrida does himself, that the deconstruction of death here depicted would also involve life itself; as usual, deconstruction does not apply itself to merely one member of a binary opposition.

In spite of these intriguing remarks, the issue of death is not central in Derrida's analysis of the death penalty. Rather, the discussion he offers revolves, to a great degree, around the conceptual triad of sovereignty, cruelty and exception. Great attention is given to the way in which abolitionist discourses, for example in Beccaria and Voltaire, paradoxically argue against the death penalty on the grounds that a life sentence would quite simply be more cruel (and thus more deterrent). In the course of a meticulous discussion of Nietzsche's Genealogy of Morals, Derrida seems to subscribe to a certain notion of the inevitability of cruelty, offering in the process a much appreciated -- and, in the context of the seminar, rare -- insight into one of his major (non-)concepts and its relation to what he once called "the economy of violence". Asking himself, and his recipients, a series of questions about the limit of cruelty, of its beginning and its end, its apogee and its essence, he evokes

the fact, following Nietzsche, that cruelty has no contrary but only different ways, different modalities, different intensities, different values (active or reactive) of being cruel, only a differance, with an a, in cruelty, a differant cruelty -- and the logic without logic of differance is that of a paradoxical economy -- a question that becomes, then, how not to be cruel? a question (how not to be cruel?) whose syntax itself allows two tonalities or two values: (1) that of fatal misfortune ("whatever I do, I can only be cruel") or (2) that of the revolt of innocence that refuses the fateful misfortune described by Nietzsche and still wonders, full of hope, how not to be cruel? what to do so as not to be cruel, in view of not being cruel, if I want to escape from the Nietzschean belief? (168)

Thus, Derrida (at least implicitly) points towards not only his early critique of Levinas in "Violence and metaphysics", with its development of the concept of "la moindre violence", but also recalls the well-known conclusion of "Structure, Sign and Play", the lecture (published in Writing and difference) that sparked his rise to fame in American academia, with its opposition of two ways to respond to the playful movement of writing (described and/or anticipated by Nietzsche) -- an affirmative one and a nostalgic-reactive one.

As already insinuated, it would have been highly beneficial to see Derrida engage more explicitly -- and in a more detailed manner -- with several of his interlocutors in the lectures, some of whom, it must be said, remain largely hidden from view. One such is Deleuze, who is never mentioned in the seminar, even if his spirit may be seen to haunt it in several locations, e.g., in the discussion of Nietzsche mentioned above. Another is Foucault, who, it must be conceded, is mentioned a few times and even given some attention in one of the sessions. But, in a seminar dedicated to the "right of life and death over the citizen" (15), the absence of any serious engagement with Foucault's writings from Discipline and Punish onwards remains glaring. As a matter of fact, however, and as can be gathered from the Editorial Note, Foucault's key conception of bio-power really was addressed in the seminar by a student presentation given on 1 March 2000. As it happens, I was present in Derrida's seminar that day, and witnessed a fascinating discussion where Derrida made all sorts of surprisingly clear-cut remarks related to Foucault's theoretical constructs, up to and including the confession that he didn't understand the concept of bio-power all too well. It is regrettable that this exchange did not make its way into the book in some form -- apart from the trace represented by the editors' remark that they did indeed come across "a brief outline", made by Derrida, "on the relation between bio-power according to Michel Foucault and the question of interest in the death penalty" which, however, they did not find necessary, or possible, to transcribe (xvi). Here, perhaps, a more effective will to engage in experimenting with the impossible would have been called for -- in the name of justice and of what is still to come.