The Death Penalty, Volume II

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Jacques Derrida, The Death Penalty, Volume II, Geoffrey Bennington, Marc Crépon, and Thomas Dutoit (eds.), Elizabeth Rottenberg (tr.), University of Chicago Press, 2016, 304 pages, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226410821.

Reviewed by Deborah Goldgaber, Louisiana State University


This is the second and final volume of Jacques Derrida's seminar on the death penalty, given at the École des hautes études en sciences sociales (Paris) from December 2000-March 2001. (The first volume, covering the previous year's lectures, was previously published in both French and English and reviewed in this journal.) In this second volume, Derrida argues that justifications for retributive justice and the death penalty (DP) are indissociable, and that this poses a particular problem for death penalty abolition. If retributivism and DP are indissociable, then abolition of DP would necessarily involve a radical re-assessment of the value and meaning of retribution. Insofar as this has not occurred -- even where we have seen de jure abolition -- we should, Derrida suggests, be suspicious of progressivist interpretations of global trends towards abolition.

Derrida's two-year research project on the death penalty was his penultimate seminar; it was followed by the Beast and the Sovereign (2001-2003) and preceded by Perjury and Pardon (1997-1999). Broadly speaking, in these seminars Derrida is concerned with traditional attributes of sovereign power: the right to take life -- to let live or let die -- to pardon, to penalize, and punish. The constellation of questions around sovereignty connects Derrida's late research to Michel Foucault's work on disciplinary and bio-power, and Agamben's work on sovereignty, political theology and, more specifically, homo sacer. Though Derrida does little to bring the results of his research in conversation with these other philosophers, these seminars provide rich material for scholars interested in making these connections explicit.

This volume will be of particular interest to those interested in how Derrida's work on sovereignty intersects with Continental philosophers such as Foucault and Agamben, and to Derrida scholars interested in this last phase of his thought. It should also be of interest to at least two other groups: 1) those concerned with philosophical justifications for retributive justice and 2) scholars working in the area of political theology interested in tracing what Derrida refers to as the "filiation" between philosophical, theological and political ideas about power and punishment.

Philosophical accounts of retribution distinguish between legitimate forms of retribution -- legally administered punishment based on the principle of jus talionis -- and illegitimate forms of retribution -- based on desire for revenge, or blood-lust. In terms of jus talionis, Derrida writes, DP is "the legal phenomenon, distinct from simple murder in principle, intention, and spirit, distinct from vengeance and sacrifice, inscribed in a law applied by a state" (40). As this definition makes explicit, the principle of retributive justice is rigorously distinguished from vengeance or sacrifice. Jus talionis, like for like or "eye for an eye," demands penalties unstintingly proportioned to guilt.

As with any other purely retributive penalty, DP is warranted if and only if it is proportional to the crime. Kant famously insists that for the crime of taking a life, only DP is proportional: "If you kill, you must die" (99). The categorical imperative demands a life for a life; the murderer, Kant argues, has in the very act certified his own execution (86-87). If one subscribes to the principle of jus talionis -- and as a rational being, one has no choice in this regard -- one has always already sanctioned DP.

Derrida admirably reconstructs Kantian logic with respect to DP, but he also carefully considers philosophical positions that oppose DP. Indeed, he devotes considerable attention, in this and the previous volume, to Beccaria, who argues for the impermissibility of DP on retributive grounds. It is surprising, then, that Derrida argues that no "rational discourse" has ever opposed the death penalty. "No philosopher has been able to exclude or condemn the death penalty on principle. Philosophy remains in principle on the side of the death penalty" (26). Here it may seem as if Derrida cedes too much ground to Kant, unaccountably dismissing those who argue that retributive justice does not demand DP. However, his point seems to be about how philosophers have argued against DP. Because DP and punishment more generally are typically justified by the same principle -- retributivism -- one could either argue against retributivism altogether (in the name of non-violence) or one can argue that retributivism does not demand DP. What philosophers have not done is distinguish DP -- and its principle -- from that of retributivist punishment.

Is it possible, Derrida asks, "to oppose the principle of the death penalty or to oppose it with something that is called an unconditional principle" (2). How is the sort of opposition that Derrida envisions here different from the way that retributivist abolitionists have opposed DP? The latter characteristically argue (1) that with respect to legitimate retributive aims, DP is out of proportion -- too excessive or too lenient, and (2) that DP is motivated by illegitimate, non-retributivism aims (i.e. sacrifice or vengeance). Beccaria, as Derrida notes, opposes DP on both grounds. What is wrong with this argumentative strategy? If we do not oppose DP with the unconditional principle of retributive justice, what other unconditional principle is there? Is Derrida arguing that the principle of retributive justice ought to be subordinated to another, supernumerary principle or value (e.g. mercy, forgiveness, utility)? Or, is he claiming that the principle of the death penalty -- whatever it may be -- illicitly determines or conditions the principle of retribution?

For Beccaria, DP is not proportional, and hence it is unnecessary. Jus talionis requires not the death of the murderer -- the latter is insufficient "pay-back" given the nature of the crime -- but a lifetime of reparation by the criminal (99). Beccaria also argues that the principle of DP is foreign to the aims of retribution. Properly understood, DP is not a retributive penalty at all, but the arrogation of sovereign power that uses retributive language as an alibi for political aims (23). Hence, by accepted principles of retribution, DP is unacceptable. Beccaria opposes the unconditional principle of jus talionis -- proportion in punishment -- to the illegitimacy of the principle animating the death penalty: "By what right can men presume to slaughter their fellows? Certainly not by the authority from which sovereignty and law derive . . . The death penalty is not a right but the war of a nation against a citizen" (23, emphasis in original).

If it is possible to argue, as does Beccaria, that the principle of DP is foreign to the sphere of justice, why does Derrida think we must unconditionally oppose the DP in a way that threatens to make the principle of jus talionis conditional? Moreover, Derrida seems to agree with Beccaria's genetic analysis; DP and its principle are "foreign" to the logic of jus talionis. He disagrees, however, that pointing out the genetic heterogeneity of DP is sufficient for rejecting it as a tool of retributive justice. To the contrary, Derrida argues that the heterogeneity of DP reveals the extent to which jus talionis is circumscribed by, and established on, a "sacrificial logic" it cannot correct or relinquish. He makes this argument through readings of figures as diverse as Walter Benjamin, psychoanalyst Theodore Reik, and the right-wing jurist and theologian Donoso Cortés. For the sake of economy, I will reconstruct Derrida's argument as it appears in his reading of Kant.

As we have seen, Kant argues that DP is necessary in the case of murder and that DP's uselessness with respect to the demands of utility or revenge is evidence of its purely retributive value. Pure retributivism insists that nothing can be done to harm the dignity of the person in the criminal. For Kant, DP recognizes the absolute value of life, and life's incommensurability with any other value, so that any lesser penalty would treat the crime of murder disproportionality (99-100). Derrida argues that if the logic of retribution has essentially to do with the question of reparation -- and hence with the calculability of tort -- Kant's insistence on the incalculability of the harm involves a break with the principle of retributive justice. Where compensation may be denominated in life ("time served"), death necessarily involves a break with the redemptive logic of retribution (159-160). Unlike any other penalty, DP does not operate according to a logic of nullification through the payment of a finite debt. DP is not just one penalty among others on a schedule of calculable, commensurate penalties for harms inflicted; it is an exceptional penalty, and operates according to the logic of exception. It is proportional, given the disproportionate harm that is murder. DP is necessarily excessive with respect to the reparative, restorative logic of jus talionis; it grapples with, and signifies, the irreparable.

If jus talionis names the possibility of paying for harms, then the death penalty marks the limit of retributivist calculability. "The condemned one, once executed, disappears before even being able to pay any penalty whatsoever. The legal subject, the subject of the penalty is cancelled out and not sublated" (49). The subject of the death penalty, the one who cannot expiate for crime, whose life cannot be used to pay for harms, whose life is no longer a currency, is not, Derrida insists, anymore the subject of jus talionis:

Once it is no longer a finite punishment, once it exceeds the limit, and precisely exceeds the finite life of the subject being punished, then the punishment, the death penalty, becomes infinite and thereby loses its essence as punishment, its punitive value. Is an infinite punishment still a punishment? Is it a human punishment? It is perhaps a divine punishment, or a punishment commensurate with an infinite being, but is it a finite punishment, a punishment commensurate with a finite being, be it a rational one? (33-34).

Punishment can only be properly retributive so long as the currency is life and the punishment is finite. By contrast, we cannot understand the act of putting someone to death outside of a scene of vengeance or a sacrificial logic.

In his reading of Kant, Derrida argues that the principle of the DP both violates and institutes the logic of jus talionis. With respect to the principle of retributivism, it is exceptional. However, DP's exceptionality does not sanction its abolition or suspension in favor of another, more proportional penalty. DP reveals the irrational supplement at the heart of justifications for retributive justice (245).

DP marks a kind of break-down with respect to the logic of calculability that jus talionis institutes. It is precisely because there is no proportional (commensurate) response to taking a life that DP appears proportional. Derrida's point is not to suggest that murder should go unpunished, but that, so long as life is a transcendent ("incalculable") value, it cannot be included in a system of justice that is premised on calculability. By our own measures, taking a life requires extra-ordinary justice.

We cannot, therefore, reject DP in favor of jus talionis -- DP is not out of proportion. It is rather the principle of retributive justice that does not fit the crime. DP shows the conditional and circumscribed nature of retribution, which, Derrida argues, gets its sense, at least in part, from the way it translates the logic of sacrifice (179). The unconditional principle of DP is not rooted in jus talionis (an eye for an eye, a life for a life), but rather, as right-wing jurist and theologian Donoso Cortés writes, in the insuperable belief in the expiative power of blood:

citing Hebrews 9:22 [Cortés writes]: 'Sine sanguinis effusione non fit remissio," no remission, no forgiveness without the shedding of blood. In other words, forgiveness and redemption are linked to the blood that flows. No redemption without blood. And it is from there that [Cortes] arrives at the death penalty; from this follows . . . not only the legitimacy, but also the necessity and fittingness of the death penalty, which naturally presupposes that the death penalty is interpreted as bloody sacrifice.

Derrida concludes with a figure like Cortés because where the philosopher, as Derrida has argued, obscures the link between retributive justice and sacrifice, the latter qua theologian makes it explicit. Opposing the death penalty requires contesting not the principle of jus talionis, but the older "logic" of sacrifice upon which jus talionis is scaffolded. Cortés, a strident anti-abolitionist, insists that if we relinquish the sacrificial logic of the death penalty, we threaten the very foundation of criminal law, and punishment. Though Derrida is not an anti-abolitionist, he endorses Cortés' logic. DP and the idea of punishment are indissociable.

It is hard to see how to practically oppose a belief in the expiative power of blood sacrifice, if we scarcely know how to avow it (215). On the other hand, does not the modern insistence on bloodless punishments and executions (viz., lethal injection) testify to a loss of faith in sacrificial logics? If we grant Derrida this speculative link between DP and sacrifice, can we not tell an optimistic story about the progressive abolition of DP in the majority of nations? May we conclude that growing distaste for even bloodless executions are the sign of something like rational progress with respect to punishment? Or should we rather conclude that sacrifice and expiation have found a new scene and new, non-retributivist alibis? Derrida leaves the question open: "Is the abolition of the death penalty, will it be, will it have been an event in history, in history as the history of humanity?" (21), suggesting that the radical abolition of the death penalty would involve something like a new beginning for humanity.