The Demands of Reason: An Essay on Pyrrhonian Scepticism

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Casey Perin, The Demands of Reason: An Essay on Pyrrhonian Scepticism, Oxford UP, 2010, 130 pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199557905.

Reviewed by Filip Grgić, Institute of Philosophy, Zagreb


A comprehensive and systematic interpretation of Pyrrhonian scepticism as it is presented in the works of Sextus Empiricus is probably not possible. His treatises are collections of a vast array of arguments stemming from various sources from Pyrrhonian tradition and elsewhere, arguments that often strongly differ in their strength and aims. The best known of these treatises, Outlines of Pyrrhonism, is also not amenable to a fully coherent interpretation, as Casey Perin rightly remarks in the "Introduction" of his book (5-6). So instead of offering a comprehensive interpretation of Sextus, he discusses several central topics from the Outlines -- such as the nature of sceptical investigation, the scope and character of the suspension of judgement, and the problem of beliefs, appearances, and action -- that have been the main bones of contention among scholars in the last decades. In this short book, Perin has defended a well argued, clear, and challenging interpretation of some of the central aspects of Pyrrhonian scepticism. In this respect, The Demands of Reason is a major contribution to Sextus scholarship. At the same time, it shows that Sextus is still able to engage a contemporary reader.

Perin's main objective is to challenge the interpretation according to which the scepticism of the Outlines can be characterized as a form of anti-rationalism. Some scholars have argued that Sextus' sceptic abandons the search for truth once he has observed that his ultimate goal, tranquillity, regularly follows upon suspension of judgement. Moreover, it has been held that the sceptics' use of certain types of argument, notably Agrippa's modes, commit them to the view that the search for truth is futile. Thus Gisela Striker, one of the main proponents of such an interpretation, ascribes to the Pyrrhonists the view that "there is no need to fall back on reason and argument in everyday life because all of it can be conducted by following the appearances that come to us involuntarily, untainted by the influence of reason."[1] Perin wants to argue that such a view of Sextan scepticism fails to capture its most important characteristics. He does not deny that reason has a restricted role for the Pyrrhonists, but insists that it does have a role, especially in that their central recommendation, that one should suspend judgement in all matters, is guided by the aim to satisfy the demands of reason.

In Chapter 1 ("The Search for Truth") Perin discusses the character and aim of sceptical investigation. Sextus insists that, while other groups of philosophers have announced that they have found the truth (positive dogmatists, like Epicureans or Stoics) or that the truth cannot be found (negative dogmatists, that is, Academics like Clitomachus and Carneades and their followers), the sceptics are "still investigating" (Outlines of Pyrrhonism [PH] 1.3). While Sextus is not explicit about what exactly it is that the sceptics are investigating, Perin argues that they are, like other philosophers, engaged in the search for truth. On the other hand, however, there seem to be some reasons to think that the search for truth is incompatible with the sceptics' position. For Sextus also says that the goal of scepticism is the achievement of tranquillity, and he defines scepticism as the ability to achieve tranquillity through suspension of judgement. So if the discovery of truth is just a means to achieving tranquillity, and, on the other hand, it appears to the sceptic that tranquillity regularly follows upon suspension of judgement, it seems that the sceptic has every reason to abandon the search for truth, for even if it is successful, it cannot achieve tranquillity. If this is so, then scepticism cannot be seen as a kind of philosophy, contrary to what Sextus insists.

Perin wants to argue that there is no real conflict here. The crucial question is why the sceptic is interested in finding the truth in the first place. One might get the impression that he is interested in truth merely as a means to tranquillity, that is, that the sceptic wants to know whether it is the case that p only because he wants to achieve tranquillity, i.e., eliminate the distress he feels because of the ignorance concerning p. Perin insists that this cannot be so. For the sceptic is distressed precisely because he has an interest in knowing whether p is the case, that is, because he has an interest in truth for its own sake. Thus, an interest in truth for its own sake precedes and explains the distress, and the desire to alleviate the distress is, in turn, the desire for tranquillity. Perin argues that it is precisely because he has an interest in truth for its own sake that the sceptic can take the discovery of truth as a means to achieving tranquillity. It follows, then, that the sceptic has an interest in truth both for its own sake and as a means to tranquillity. The search for truth, of course, presupposes that the truth can indeed be found, and Perin shows that the sceptics' use of Agrippan strategy does not, contrary to what is sometimes thought, commit them to the view that the truth cannot be found.

Perin's interpretation is convincing, elegant, and well argued. A possible objection might be that he uses too restricted a notion of investigation. Commenting on PH 1.1-3, he says: "In fact I doubt whether investigation can be understood as anything but the search for truth, but I am claiming here only that investigation as Sextus understands it -- the activity he claims the Sceptic is engaged in -- is the search for truth" (8). While I agree that this may be the most natural reading of PH 1.1-3, it seems to me that there is much more in Sextus' notion of investigation than the discovery of truth. For the sceptical investigation is also aimed at the avoidance of false beliefs (or, as the sceptics would put it, of precipitate assent), and includes the careful examination of dogmatic theories; moreover, they also investigate whether there are such things as truth and the true (and argue that there are no such things [PH 2.80], or, alternatively, that we should suspend judgement about them [2.94]). So perhaps it would be more appropriate to say that sceptical investigations are guided by an interest in truth in a more general sense, and not only by the interest in discovering which of p and not-p is true. That is to say, we may grant that the source of distress is the failure to know which of p and not-p is true, so that the sceptics embark upon investigation because they have an interest in truth for its own sake, but perhaps we should leave open which truth-related value is such that it can be expected to remove the distress. The desire to discover the truth may be the sceptics' original motive; but as their investigation progresses, they may become aware that there are many more truth-related values they want to satisfy for their own sake.

Perin argues that in the Outlines we can find an argument that is in tension with the view that discovery of truth is a means to achieving tranquillity. This is the value argument, as he calls it, according to which the source of distress is not ignorance, but any belief about the goodness or badness of something, from which it follows that "discovering the truth about the value of something is an obstacle, not a means, to tranquillity. For, obviously, to discover the truth about the value of something is to come to know, and hence to believe, either that it is good or that it is bad" (25). So if the source of distress is, as Sextus argues, the belief that some things are good or bad, then, if a person believes that x is good, she must, to remove the distress, eliminate this belief, and not discover the truth. I agree that the value argument can be seen as a deviation with respect to the rest of the Outlines, but it seems to me that things are perhaps more complicated. A person may believe that x is good and feel distressed because of this, but, if she has an interest in truth both for its own sake and as a means to tranquillity, she may believe that in this case, too, an investigation guided by her interest in truth will remove the distress. So she may set out to examine whether the proposition that x is good is indeed worthy of assent and discover that the criteria for the application of the term "good" are so confused that, after scrutiny, her assent to the proposition that x is good turns out to be an instance of a precipitate assent.

In Chapter 2 ("Necessity and Rationality") Perin addresses the character of the sceptics' suspension of judgement. Sextus often writes that suspension is a matter of necessity, i.e., that the fact that the conflict between candidates for belief is equipollent compels one to suspend judgement. Perin describes this kind of necessity as causal or psychological necessity: it appears to the sceptic that a psychological state of one type (the appearance of conflict and equipollence) causes a psychological state of another type (suspension). Taken in this sense, suspension is something that is entirely passive. Perin does not deny that the necessity attached to the sceptic's suspension is causal, but insists that this cannot be the whole story. For Sextus not only says that one is compelled or forced to suspend judgement but he also says that in certain situations the dogmatist will immediately concede that it is necessary to suspend judgement (PH 2.19), or that it is right to suspend judgement (2.96). This suggests that the necessity involved in suspension is not just causal. Perin describes it as a kind of hypothetical necessity: it is necessary for sceptics or dogmatist sto suspend judgement if they want to satisfy certain rational requirements. The relevant rational requirement in the case of the dogmatists is

(SJ) Rationality requires one to suspend judgement about whether p if one believes there is no reason to believe either p or its negation (40),

while the rational requirement the sceptics want to satisfy is

(SJ*) Rationality requires one to suspend judgement about whether p if it appears to one that there is no reason to believe either p or its negation (43),

where "appears" should be taken non-doxastically, which means that by saying that it appears to him that p the sceptic does not attribute to himself the belief that p. Thus both the dogmatists and the sceptics aim to satisfy the demands of reason, which is to be expected, given that they are both engaged in the rational activity of searching for truth. We might ask what (SJ*) has to do with rationality, since it is stated in terms of what (non-doxastically) appears to one to be the reason for belief. Perin's answer is that (SJ) and (SJ*) are instances of general requirements of rationality with respect to belief, and, as such, they say only that we should not have a belief "that conflicts with the attitude that controls the formation, retention, and revision of that belief" (44).

Now, there are a variety of other ways in which Sextus announces suspension as a conclusion of sceptical arguments: he not only says that one must suspend judgement or that it is right to do so but he also says that one "arrives" at suspension (1.8, 1.91) and "concludes" to it (1.35, 1.123, 3.49), that it is "introduced" (1.117), that it "follows" (1.166), etc. What should we make of these cases? Perin tackles this question very briefly (p. 47, n. 24), and says that such descriptions are neutral with regard to whether the manner in which suspension follows is a matter of causal or hypothetical necessity. It seems to me, however, that at least some of these cases give support to the hypothetical interpretation. Take, for instance, the conclusion of Aenesidemus' fourth mode, where Sextus says that "the suspension of judgement about external existing objects is introduced (eisagetai)" (1.117). Reasoning leading to this conclusion seems to me to have basically the same structure as the argument in 3.34-6, where Sextus, according to Perin, relies on (SJ) or (SJ*). Let me also note that PH 2.253 may be taken as a clear example, not discussed by Perin, of a dogmatist (Chrysippus) who must suspend judgement if he wants to satisfy (SJ).

Chapter 3 ("The Scope of Scepticism") turns to one of the most discussed topics in recent scholarship, the problem of the sceptics' beliefs. While Sextus insists that the sceptics suspend judgement about everything, which suggests that they have absolutely no beliefs, he nevertheless puts the restriction on the scope of scepticism and says that the sceptics do have some beliefs (dogmata), if belief is taken just as acquiescing in something, i.e., as an assent to the affection forced upon one in accordance with an appearance. The question is, what kind of mental state this is and whether we can call it "belief" in the standard sense. Perin's suggestion is that the beliefs the sceptics have -- or non-dogmatic beliefs, as he calls them -- are beliefs about how things appear to them, while beliefs they lack -- or dogmatic beliefs -- are beliefs about how things are. While this solution is not novel, Perin supports it by a very clear argument and persuasive interpretation of the central passage (PH 1.13). He also offers a detailed criticism of an alternative and influential view proposed by Michael Frede.

Now, if dogmata that the sceptics admit are dogmata about how things appear to them, then the question arises: does this mean that they have beliefs in the standard sense of that term? While it may be controversial what exactly is included in having a belief, it seems obvious that to believe p is to take p to be true. Some commentators have rejected this and insisted that the sceptics' beliefs, as opposed to the dogmatists' beliefs, do not include accepting a proposition as true.[2] Others have endorsed the standard account, but claimed that, as it was the common view among the ancient philosophers that the reports about how things appear do not have a truth value, they could not think that there are beliefs about how things appear.[3] Perin rejects both lines of interpretation: he argues both that non-dogmatic belief includes accepting a proposition as true and that it is a genuine belief. His main piece of evidence is PH 1.215, where Sextus reports that someone has identified scepticism with Cyrenaicism because they both claim that we apprehend (katalambanesthai) only our own affections (pathē), which suggests, according to him, that the sceptics have knowledge of what appears to them. He further suggests that

if, as Sextus claims, the Sceptic has knowledge of how things appear to him, and if belief is a constituent of knowledge, then he has beliefs about how things appear to him. But it is difficult to see how it is possible for the Sceptic (or anyone else) to believe p, and in doing so to know p, without accepting p as true. (69)

I am not certain, however, that the standard distinction between knowledge and belief applies in this case. The Cyrenaics take beliefs about their own pathē as infallible and incorrigible,[4] and the same can be said about the sceptics' beliefs about how things appear: they do not admit of being false. In this respect, the sceptical dogma is more like knowledge than like belief.

One of the main functions commonly attributed to belief is to guide our actions. However, when he argues against the famous apraxia objection -- which says, roughly, that scepticism is incompatible with action -- Sextus does not appeal to sceptical dogmata. As Perin shows in Chapter 4 ("Appearances and Action"), he is right in not doing so, for beliefs about how things appear to one cannot guide one's actions. Sextus argues instead that the explanation of actions should be given in terms of appearances. In Perin's account,

The explanation of any action the Sceptic performs will have the form 'S does action A because he desires to φ and it appears to him that p' where p is, typically, a complex proposition that relates the doing of A to φ-ing and so to the satisfaction of the desire to φ. For example, the Sceptic drinks a glass of water because he is thirsty, i.e., has a desire to drink, and it appears to the Sceptic that there is a glass of water in front of him and that he can drink it. The appearance to which the explanation of the Sceptic's action appeals is not a belief, but it is an analogue to belief in the sense that it plays the role in the explanation of the Sceptic's actions that belief plays in the explanation of the non-Sceptic's actions. (96-7)

Things are, however, somewhat more complicated, as Perrin shows, primarily because Sextus does not make it clear how an appearance is different from a belief. In any case, it would be wrong to conclude that, because the sceptics are guided by appearances rather than by beliefs, they want to entirely reject reason. On the contrary, their appeal to appearances is the result of their attempt to satisfy the requirements of reason: "In this way the restriction placed on the role of reason in the Sceptic's life is a restriction reason places on itself" (117-8).

[1] G. Striker, "Scepticism as a Kind of Philosophy", Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 83 (2001), p. 122.

[2] M. Frede, "The Sceptic's Two Kinds of Assent and the Question of the Possibility of Knowledge", in M. Burnyeat and M. Frede (eds.), The Original Sceptics: A Controversy, Indianapolis/Cambridge, 1997, pp. 133-8.

[3] See M. Burnyeat, "Idealism and Greek Philosophy: What Descartes Saw and Berkeley Missed", The Philosophical Review 91 (1982), pp. 25-27.

[4] See on this in V. Tsouna, The Epistemology of the Cyrenaic School, Cambridge, 1998, esp. pp. 3-4.