The Dialectics of Aesthetic Agency: Revaluating German Aesthetics from Kant to Adorno

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Ayon Maharaj, The Dialectics of Aesthetic Agency: Revaluating German Aesthetics from Kant to Adorno, Bloomsbury, 2013, 212pp., $37.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781472579591.

Reviewed by Jason M. Miller, Warren Wilson College


In his debut monograph Ayon Maharaj develops the core argument of his 2009 doctoral dissertation into an original and meticulously crafted account of aesthetic agency in its conceptual evolution from Kant to Adorno. The central argument -- that art can offer uniquely valuable and revealing forms of experience -- is, of course, nothing new: it is one of the central claims of German Idealism's challenge to the sovereignty of Enlightenment rationality. Similarly, the historical arc is a familiar one, proceeding from Kantian to Romantic to Hegelian aesthetics and culminating with Adorno's post-romantic synthesis of these competing traditions. Nor, for that matter, is the attempt to rescue the claims of Idealist aesthetics for the present without precedent; Maharaj joins a growing chorus of recent thinkers (e.g., Robert Pippin, J.M. Bernstein, William Desmond) attempting to revisit and rethink those claims from a contemporary standpoint.

Rather, what sets this work apart from comparable works exploring the art-agency relation from Kant onward[1] is that it deftly plays between antithetical attitudes toward the notion of aesthetic agency. One is the post-Enlightenment glorification of art as the secular redeemer of a disenchanted modernity, the other a skeptical rejection of aesthetic agency as the residual metaphysics of a bygone era. At this critical juncture, Maharaj argues, we are presented with a false dichotomy between modernism's uncritical optimism and the radical negativity of postmodern aesthetics. Between these extremes he develops a "dialectical" defense of aesthetic agency that acknowledges both the capacities and limitations of art's role in human self-awareness. The work presents a historically grounded analysis of how these competing tendencies of art -- enchantment and disenchantment -- stand in various stages of dialectical interdependence with one another. Even if one wants to criticize particular features of this presentation, or its completeness, one has to commend this work as a powerful and timely defense of aesthetic agency. It is a welcome line of argument for those of us who can neither naively ascribe to art the power of spiritual redemption nor cynically reduce art to the purpose of entertainment, pleasure, or emotional catharsis.

Maharaj starts us off with a fairly technical bit of legwork concentrating on a series of allegedly unresolved (and unresolvable) tensions in Kant's philosophy. This brings us to the first of several bold moves in the argument, where he abandons the reconstructive approach to Kant and shows the ambivalences of the third Critique to be fundamental. These "aporias," however, prove to be the fertile breeding ground for subsequent generations of aesthetic theory, and Maharaj exerts a great deal of effort demonstrating this point. Indeed, over a third of the book is taken up with this. The first chapter focuses on the conceptual difficulties that arise in Kant's account of aesthetic pleasure in the "Analytic of the Beautiful" (viz. disinterestedness, the universality of taste, sensus communis), and the second chapter focuses on the systematic difficulties that arise in Kant's attempt to enlist aesthetic experience in bridging the "great gulf" between nature and freedom presented in the first Critique (viz. moral purposiveness).

This can seem a tedious, even unnecessary, wind-up for the far more interesting pitch that follows. Whether the problems in Kant are real or perceived, the post-Kantian contributions to the discussion of aesthetic agency are interesting and valuable in their own right. Besides, these discussions were informed by other controversial aspects of Kant's philosophy not addressed here, e.g., the relation of natural and artistic beauty. So, unless Maharaj just really wants to prove to the Paul Guyers of the world that "Kant remains profoundly ambivalent" about the phenomenology and moral implications of aesthetic pleasure, it is not clear that it is worth dying on this particular hill for the purpose of this particular narrative--even if he is right.

Of course, the immediate inheritor of Kantian aesthetic philosophy is Friedrich Schiller. That Schiller does not figure more prominently in this narrative of aesthetic agency, however, is both surprising and disappointing. Alongside the "Oldest System-Program of German Idealism," Schiller's treatise, Letters on the Aesthetic Education of Man, is marked out as one of the seminal texts of early German Romanticism. Instead of engaging the text as a complex negotiation of the social and metaphysical aspects of aesthetic experience, however, Maharaj takes the dismissive position that "Schiller remains torn between regulative and constitutive approaches to the role of beauty" (p. 70). He acknowledges the Kantian roots of Schiller's attempt to reconcile the modern rift between sense and rationality through aesthetic education, but not the Schillerian roots of Hegel's own adaptation and application of Kantian ambiguities to the problems of modern art -- which turns out to be a central theme of the book.

In place of this rich discussion, the brief excursus on Schiller serves only to segue to a more detailed treatment of Schelling's Romanticization of Kant. Whereas Schiller (according to Maharaj) vacillates between two untenable views, Schelling pivots from one untenable view to another: from a dogmatic metaphysics of art to a deflated skepticism of art's redemptive capacities. At the heart of this transition is the young Romantic's internal wrangling with Fichte's concept of an "intellectual intuition." Following Fichte, the early Schelling latches on to Kant's highly enigmatic claims about the "transcendental unity of apperception" and concludes that we can in fact have immediate, intuitive awareness of the self of the kind that Kant mentions, and explicitly rejects, in the third Critique. He then designates art as the experiential medium, or "organ," of this intuitive understanding, since it is in aesthetic experience that we gain an affective insight into nature's purposiveness, thus bridging the gap between nature and freedom. In his later work, however, Schelling begins to harbor deep doubts about the realization of these lofty ideals in concrete works of art and to reflect on the limitations of art in general. Ultimately conceding the irreparably fractured nature of humanity, Schelling abandons his aspirations for an aesthetic mythology and turns his muted aspirations toward a philosophical theology instead.

This latent skepticism in Schelling provides a convincing conceptual arc to Maharaj's account of Romantic irony, framed within a fresh take on Hegel's infamous polemic against Schlegel. This is undoubtedly one of the more exciting and enlightening discussions of the book, in large part because of Maharaj's willingness to venture well beyond the bland dismissal of Hegel's critique as simply an ad hominem attack on his Idealist contemporary. In doing so, he identifies in Hegel not only a coherent critique of ironic skepticism, but also -- and more importantly -- the makings of an alternative, dialectical form of irony. It is an original and productive line of argument harvested from the scattered writings of Hegel, both familiar and unfamiliar, including a rarely-discussed essay on F. K. W. Solger, a Berlin colleague of Hegel whom he credits as giving Romantic irony some dialectical potential.

Specifically, Maharaj's reworked critique of irony proceeds from the keen insight that Schlegelian irony entails more than the doxastic agnosticism so celebrated in postmodernist discourse. Rather, as he points out, its claims of "incomprehensibility" and "permanent parabasis" stand in precarious tension with its implicit appeals to the metaphysics and epistemic foundationalism of Fichte. From here we can say that Hegel is not simply accusing the ironic genius of a radical subjectivism born of the Fichtean "Ego," but pointing to an inconsistency in the ironist's submitting everything but his own skeptical standpoint to ironic scrutiny. At this point, however, Maharaj identifies irony as an aesthetic form of intellectual intuition, which leads him to reframe Hegel's critique of irony too narrowly as an epistemic critique of intuitional self-awareness.

Now, there are probably good reasons to question the conceptual proximity of Schlegel's concept of irony to Fichte's concept of "intellectual intuition" (not to mention Kant's). And it is worth bearing in mind that Hegel's critique is directed, not at Fichte's philosophy, but at Schlegel's alleged misappropriation of it, his "developing it in his own way and tearing himself loose from it."[2] More to the point, though, is that Maharaj identifies but one aspect of Hegel's broader claim against the ironist's contradictory relation to normativity in general. Hegel is attentive to not only the ironist's uncritical claim to a privileged epistemic status, but also the ironist's heavy trade in aesthetic, social, and ethical norms despite its claim to non-committal "parabasis." Put more concretely, a complete dialectical critique from Hegel would juxtapose Schlegel's claims expressing ironic detachment (e.g., "the will of the poet can tolerate no law above itself"[3]) with those expressing a principled commitment, such as we find in discussions of aesthetic education [Bildung], the "sociability" of art, and, in particular, a "new mythology" of poetry. This broader critique would then better correspond to Hegel's description of the ironic genius as "Nicht im Ernst"[4] -- insincere because the normative implications of irony are always undermined by its skeptical posturing, and vice versa. It would also correspond to Hegel's laudatory remarks on Solger's description of "comic solemnity" as both a "seriousness [Ernsthaftigkeit] that negates itself" and a "nothingness [Nichtigkeit] that makes itself serious [ernsthaft][5] -- remarks, I might add, that Maharaj cites as evidence of Hegel's openness to a more moderate, dialectical version of irony.

So, Maharaj's dialectical retooling of Hegel's critique of irony is both promising and perspicacious, but incomplete. The price of adhering to a narrative focus on intellectual intuition, it seems, is an oversight of a broader and equally important set of issues pertaining to that critique. Fortunately, this in no way detracts from his carrying out the positive task of reconstructing from Hegel a dialectical form of irony. Bypassing tired formulations of the "end of art" in Hegel, Maharaj cuts to a productive discussion of "art's 'after'" -- a phrase Hegel actually did use, and that optimistically intimates the possibilities of post-classical art.[6]. This reading challenges the caricature of Hegel as the enemy of modern art and portrays him as deeply invested in the question of how art "exceeds" its own limitations. This Hegel, having worked through the theories of Kant, Schiller, Winckelmann, Schelling and Schlegel, arrives at a conception of art's future as one that negates the one-sided negativity of Romantic irony and self-reflexively explores its own potential and limitations. This is, in effect, Hegel's irony, a sincere, dialectical form of irony partially realized in the literary works of Solger, Tieck and Novalis.

To be clear, Hegel's demand for sincerity or seriousness in art by no means implies that the content of art be somber or humorless. He does, however, sharply distinguish between the self-aggrandizing swagger of "subjective humor" and the more measured gait of "objective" or "true" humor, which "requires great depth and wealth of spirit" and is "in earnest" with its subject matter and representation(LFA, 602-03). Now, this very clearly tracks the previous distinction between a deficient and one-sided form of irony and its more dialectical counterpart. Here again, though, Maharaj is too quick in dismissing Hegel's account of objective humor as "decidedly unimaginative" and unpromising (p. 139), and thus too swift in his transition to the irony of Kierkegaard. Though sketchy in its details, Hegel's engagement with exemplary works of literary irony can be seen as a kind of dialectical strategy in itself: in the humor of Tristram Shandy, for example, he argues that Stern is not indulging in an ostentatious display of authorial wit, but instead depicting the banal and trivial as comical "to make what is substantial emerge out of contingency" (LFA, 602). At any rate, Hegel's discussion of objective humor, even if incomplete, deserves more attention than it receives here.

This brings us to Kierkegaard, the Dane of German philosophy. Maharaj holds up Kierkegaard's concept of irony as a model of what objective humor could be, only to drop it once it has served its narrative purpose of delivering us to the aesthetic theory of Adorno. My hunch is that other scholars will want to interrogate Maharaj's claim that Kierkegaardian irony tacitly informs Adorno's pivotal notion of the "dialectical work of art." My worry, however, is about a narrative of aesthetic agency in which Adorno has the last word. Aesthetic Theory is the uniquely valuable progeny of Kantian and Hegelian aesthetics that re-asserts the significance of art in the tragic aftermath of the Enlightenment. But if we follow the pessimistic logic that art can at best offer the dull glow of a meaningful existence amidst the bleakness of modernity, we commit to a conception of aesthetic agency that is not only massively deflated, but also at odds with contemporary artistic practices. We have to consider whether the forms of aesthetic agency put forth in contemporary art movements such as street art, relational art, socially-engaged or "committed" art are sufficiently dialectical. And I would argue that they are, on precisely Maharaj's terms: they go beyond the critical mode of permanent parabasis and engage art in the representation and evaluation of social, moral, and cultural norms.

This is a move Adorno no doubt would have balked at as naïve fodder for the enemy. But if there is one lesson to be learned from this book, it is that the historical narrative of aesthetic agency from Kant onward has been driven by the dialectical struggle between the powers and limitations of art. It seems, then, that a critique of aesthetic negativity in Adorno would prove a highly productive contribution to Maharaj's project by creating a much-needed theoretical platform for exploring the possibility of an even more robust conception of aesthetic agency, and perhaps even one that resonates well with contemporary art.

[1] Cf. Kai Hammermeister's The German Aesthetic Tradition (Cambridge University Press, 2002), Andrew Bowie's, Aesthetics and Subjectivity: from Kant to Nietzsche (Manchester University Press, 2003), and Jean-Marie Schaeffer's Art of the Modern Age: from Kant to Heidegger (Princeton University Press, 2009).

[2] Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel, Hegel's Aesthetics: Lectures on Fine Art (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975), p. 64.(Hereafter, "LFA" followed by page number).

[3] J. M. Bernstein, Classic and Romantic German Aesthetics (Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 2003), #116.

[4] Ibid, 65.

[5] Solger quoted in Maharaj, p. 110.

[6] A brief excursus: Maharaj's careful engagement with the original German here, as elsewhere in the text, can strike the reader as what I would call "grammarguments," that is, substantial interpretive claims grounded largely on grammatical subtleties; e.g., that Hegel's attitude toward modern art can be settled by determining whether "art's 'after'" indicates an objective or subjective genitive. These are always offered, however, as a supplement to, not the substance of, deep-level textual exegesis.