The Digital Cast of Being: Metaphysics, Mathematics, Cartesianism, Cybernetics, Capitalism, Communication

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Michael Eldred, The Digital Cast of Being: Metaphysics, Mathematics, Cartesianism, Cybernetics, Capitalism, Communication, Ontos, 2009, 137pp., $57.95 (hbk) ISBN 9783868380453.

Reviewed by Val Dusek, University of New Hampshire



The subtitle shows that this is a very ambitious book about a tremendously important topic. Michael Eldred examines and criticizes the atomistic world-orientation involved in digital technology, tracing this atomization back to Aristotle’s conception of time as number (using Heidegger’s comments). He continues through Descartes’ atomistic ontology and method into modern mathematics and science, including discussions of the rigorization of the calculus and the arithmetization of analysis. Eldred then discusses the contemporary digitalized economy using Marx’s concepts. Thus the work attempts to integrate a critique grounded in fundamental ontology with a critique of political economy in the digital age. This is a worthwhile and needed project.

Eldred makes use of his earlier work in logic and foundations of mathematics as well as his earlier work on Heidegger and on Marx’s economics. A professional translator, Eldred deploys knowledge of the relevant languages, history of philosophy, social ontology, and Marxist economic theory. (Perhaps for reasons of both linguistic purity and space, Eldred cites Heidegger solely by Gesamtausgabe volume and page. Reference to translations would have been helpful for Eldred’s readers who are interested in cyberspace and in Marxism but not Heidegger scholars.)1

Eldred uses Heidegger’s account of time to contrast with the mathematical, punctiform, and linear theory of time. Eldred uses the ecstasies of time, which he calls “the three dimensions of time,” past, present, and future. Eldred’s use of the term “three dimensions of time” is somewhat ironic, given his rejection of the Cartesian geometrical or physical science spatialization of time and treatment of time itself as a dimension. Eldred makes several interesting points about Heidegger. Heidegger does not note the parallel between Aristotle’s three aspects of movement and his own three ecstasies of time (p. 39n10). Heidegger’s own account of time has vestiges of the “productivism” that he frequently criticizes in others. Eldred suggests that a theory of social exchange rather than production would be a more appropriate account of time (pp. 11, 42). He notes that Heidegger, in his detailed explication and criticism of Aristotle’s account of time, never questions the account of time as quantitative (p. 41 n12).

The title of Eldred’s Chapter 4, “Spatiality of the electromagnetic medium” and the constant use of “electromagnetic medium” to refer to digital communication is a bit misleading. The “electronic medium” would be more appropriate as this emphasizes the particulate nature of computational processes (photoelectric effect). Many of the metaphysical understandings of the electromagnetic field, from the Daoist magnetic compass through German Romantic accounts inspired by Oersted’s and Faraday’s electromagnetic interaction and field, were holistic, not atomistic.2 Maxwell and early Maxwellians understood the electron as an excitation of the field. The Copenhagen interpretation of quantum theory claimed to synthesize the atomistic and the continuous. However, post-relativistic quantum field theory led many theorists to reemphasize the priority of the field concept in the manner of the early Maxwellians. Steven Weinberg, anti-philosophical scourge of postmodernism, sees the field as the primary reality and particles as excitations of the field, while Frank Wilczek claims the particles are manifestations of an ether-like space that he calls “the grid.” Despite the atomistic, discrete nature of electronics and digital computers, the “electromagnetic” realm is presented as non-atomistic and non-discrete in fundamental theory.3 Eldred is correct in calling the distant communication the electromagnetic medium, but somewhat misleading in using the same term for digital processes.

Eldred correctly focuses on the mesh between digital thinking and the modern economy, both in terms of the communications and banking industries and in terms of economic circulation. However, given his primary focus on Marx, several aspects of this economic phenomenon are not mentioned, such as the “velocity of money” in the equation of the classical quantity theory of money. Eldred emphasizes the speeding up of transfer of money via electronic communication but does so only within the Marxist monetary framework.

There is an appendix on quantum mechanics and time in relation to the Heisenberg Principle. Surprisingly the author does not discuss speculations about the “chronon”, or discrete atom of time, whether in the mid-twentieth century work of Werner Heisenberg and Henry Margenau or in the work of more recent quantum field theorists.

I disagree with Eldredge on his interpretation of the role of superposition in the interpretation of the temporal relation of quantum states. He rejects the thesis that the evolution of the states in quantum theory is deterministic, while the sequence of positions and momenta of the individual particles is statistical. He claims that superposition already builds indeterminism into the evolution of quantum states. However, non-superposition states would be deterministic with statistical cashing out in predictions of individual measurements. Even in superposition, the additive combinations of states are weird but deterministic before the collapse of the wave packet in terms of probabilities. (Eldred uses web encyclopaedia articles and course sites for his treatment of quantum theory and relativity so that the work lacks the thoroughness of survey present in his discussions of Heidegger, Marx, and pure mathematical analysis.)

An earlier internet version of the book has an informative appendix on the continuum as treated by predicative mathematics by Hermann Weyl, John Bell, and Solomon Feferman, et al. This has been dropped, perhaps for reasons of space, which is too bad. Weyl developed predicative notions in The Continuum4, briefly allied with L. E. J. Brouwer’s intuitionistism, but finally dropped his attempt to integrate an intuitionistic or even predicative theory of the continuum with his general relativity theory. The pure intuitionistic continuum of Brouwer is not constituted of a nondenumerable set of points, but more resembles the Aristotelian continuum as a site of potential points. (Eldred’s appendix and an article on the mathematical continuum, as well as his other works, can be found on Eldred’s website

Although Eldred uses the Marxist political economy to discuss the role of digital being in the economy, he does not discuss the social and political basis of the atomized conception of time, which he treats in the first half of the work as purely a matter of intellectual history. Aristotle and Descartes are seen as the founders of the atomized time, and Heidegger as the correct alternative. Along with the Cartesian atomization and arithmetization of time, the development of the mechanical clock and the machinery of the industrial revolution were producing an atomization of time that paralleled, fed, and reinforced the intellectual trend. Edward P. Thompson did a classic study of the role of the factory and clock in this change of consciousness.5 Numerous studies from Lewis Mumford on have linked the rise of the clock and the disciplining and slicing of work and human life by ever more divided units of time. Anthropologists and anthropologically-influenced historians, such as the French Annales school, who, in turn, influenced the Marxism of Louis Althusser, have noted the role of different temporal rhythms and cycles in the account of history. These social analyses within Marxism, including Marcuse’s, should have a greater role to play in a Marxist analysis of the alienation attendant on digital or discrete time than Eldred allows. Eldred approaches these issues as an ontologist and does not want to derive digitalization from economic and “mere” sociological influences.6 However, one could claim that Heidegger’s treatment of time in fundamental ontology is correct, but that the “fallen” modes of time-awareness and time description are a product of capitalism and social individualism.

Eldred ignores the whole postmodern claim that the predominance of information and communication has made Marxist analyses of production obsolescent. There certainly is the “modes of information” analysis of forms of media as replacing modes of production, and the claim that the rise of the service economy (ambiguous as the notion is) has replaced the productivist, manufacturing economy, at least in the developed countries. Eldred sidesteps this approach, but his own value-form approach also shifts the emphasis from Marx’s productivist economics of manufacture to an emphasis on exchange and circulation more appropriate to the contemporary financialization of the economy.

Surprisingly, given his theme, topic, and mathematical comprehension, Eldred does not discuss Claude Shannon’s information theory, which seems to fit seamlessly into the digitalization of being and the global network of communication. Alfred Borgmann, for instance, has made a very preliminary and dystopian stab at a Heideggerian account of information.7 Someone with Eldred’s thorough knowledge of Heidegger, combined with the mathematical skills needed to investigate and characterize information theory at a much deeper level than does Borgmann, would be well placed to tackle a better Heideggerian critique of information theory.

Another topic that Eldred mentions in passing, the carry-over of the digital code notion to DNA genetics, could have been further developed (p. 72). There is a dispute among philosophers of molecular biology and genetics regarding how serious or how literally to take talk of “genetic information” in molecular biology. Some (Sahotra Sarkar, and Evelyn Fox Keller) have claimed that information talk serves merely as a sort of external ideological window dressing to molecular biology and does no real scientific work. Others (Maynard Smith, Peter Godfrey Smith) take talk of genetic information more literally. Whatever its worth, information talk has been reinforced by the growth of the field of bioinformatics out of computer scans of base sequences in the Human Genome Project and its congeners.

Eldred rejects strongly deterministic interpretations of Marx, not surprisingly, as do most “Western Marxists”, but seems to do so even more completely, even in terms of the “trends” of vol. 3 of Capital. Eldred’s rejection of constraints of any sort moves him to a position closer to the early understanding of Sartre than to Heidegger. Furthermore, he rejects the labor theory of value and the Marxist theory of alienation. He plausibly says one does not need to accept Marx’s human nature and value theory of alienation to accept that alienation exists in modern societies. After all, Kierkegaard, Heidegger and others have religion and “human condition” accounts of alienation. However, when one adds up all these rejections on the part of Eldred, one wonders whether he needs to incorporate Marx at all into his Heideggerian account. Other Heideggerian Marxists such as Herbert Marcuse8 attempt to integrate Heidegger’s account of time with Marx’s account of time in the labor process. Eldred’s Marx is closer to those that emphasize “the logic of capital” than to the ‘Heideggerian Marxism’ of Marcuse or Andrew Feenberg.

Eldred, who did decades of productive scholarship and writing on the value-form interpretation of Marxism9, seems in recent years to have divested himself of so many of Marx’s theses that the retention of the Marxist apparatus may be a residue of habit. In his social ontology and other recent writings, he defends capitalism as not intrinsically unjust, so long as a level playing field for the conflict of entrepreneurs and between capital and labor is maintained. (He praises in the manner of Georges Sorel the struggle of powers between capital and labor. His appreciation of this opposition of powers sounds more Nietzschean than Marxist.) Eldred dismisses claims about injustice of grossly disparate economic rewards or the power of the capitalist to hire and fire workers as envy and resentment. Marx did consider capitalism to be just on its own terms, by holding an historically relative conception of justice. In more recent writings Eldred seems to believe that capitalism and freedom are intrinsically related, but more along the lines of Milton Friedman than those of Marx (both of whom link formal freedom with capitalism), insofar as Eldred rejects the notion of any solidarity superior to capitalist freedom.10 Eldred’s emphasis on the money form rather than the concrete or even physiological notion of labor is valuable in that it makes Marxism better able to deal with the financial explosion and productive stagnation of recent decades. However, Eldred seems to have dropped most of that original Marxism with respect to critical evaluation of the market or envisaging a society beyond possessive individualism.

The recent Eldred describes capitalism as the “gainful game” and wishes to contrast a totally indeterminate play with Marxist laws or even trends and with quantitative and predictive social science in general. However, it is well to remember that games of chance gave rise to the theory of probability contemporary with Descartes, and to twentieth century game theory.

The Digital Cast of Being is a very ambitious attempt to integrate fundamental ontology with a social ontology of the digital economy. It is worth reading and pondering.

For a work that covers such a variety of topics it is unfortunate that an index is not included.

1 English translations of the main texts of Heidegger on number, time and Aristotle cited by Eldred, besides Being and Time, are: Basic Concepts of Aristotle’s Philosophy, Indiana, 2009, Second Part., Ch. 2 pp. 192-222; Plato’s Sophist, Indiana, 2003, Excursus: General Orientation Regarding the Essence of Mathematics, pp. 69-82; and The Basic Problems of Phenomenology, Indiana, 1982, Section 19, a) Historical Orientation Concerning the Traditional Concept of Time, pp. 231-256.

2 Dusek, Val, The Holistic Inspirations of Science: An Underground History of Electromagnetic Field Theory, Rutgers UP, 1999.

3 Weinberg, Steve, Dreams of a Final Theory, Random House, 1992, p. 25. Frank Wilczek, The Lightness of Being, Basic Books, 2008.

4 Weyl, Hermann, The Continuum, Dover Publications, 1994.

5 Thompson, Edward P., “Time, Work Discipline, and Industrial Capitalism,” Past and Present, 38 (1967): 56-97.

6 Thomson, George, The First Philosophers¸ Humanities Press, 1978; Richard Seaford, Money and the Early Greek Mind, Cambridge UP, 2004; Karl Polanyi, "Aristotle Discovers the Economy," in Trade and Market in the Early Empires, ed. Karl Polanyi, Conrad M. Arensberg, and Harry W. Pearson, Henry Regenry, 1956; Alfred Sohn-Rethel, Intellectual and Manual Labor, Macmillan Press, 1983; Gad Freudenthal, Atom and Individual in the Age of Newton, Kluwer, 1986.

7 Alfred Borgmann, Holding on the Reality, University of Chicago, 2000.

8 Marcuse, Herbert, "Contributions to a Phenomenology of Historical Materialism," trans. Douglas Kellner, Telos 4 (Fall 1969); “Foundations of the Concept of Labor in Economics,” Telos 16 (Summer 1973): 9-37.

9 For instance in Thesis Eleven, with Mike Roth, (Translators’ Preface), “On the Dialectics of Value Form,” vol. 1, 1980, pp. 94-99; with Mamie Hanlon, Lucia Kleber, and Mike Roth “Reconstructing Value-Form Analysis,” “1: the Analysis of Commodities and Money,” vol. 4, 1982, pp. 170-188, “2: The Analysis of Capital-Wage-Labor Relation and Capitalist Production,” vol. 7, 1983, pp. 87-111; and with Marnie Hanlon, “Reconstructing Value-Form Analysis” Capital and Class, no. 13, Spring 1981, pp. 24-57.

10 See last few pages of Eldred, “Exchange, Value, Justice — Aristotle, Adam Smith, and Karl Marx,” and “Why Social Justice is a Specious Idea” at http//