The Discourse of the Syncope: Logodaedalus

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Jean-Luc Nancy, The Discourse of the Syncope: Logodaedalus, Saul Anton (tr.), Stanford University Press, 2008, 164pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804753548.

Reviewed by Katie Terezakis, Rochester Institute of Technology


Jean-Luc Nancy published Le Discours de la syncope: I. Logodaedalus in 1976, the same year Derrida published Glas and Foucault brought out the first volume of The History of Sexuality. "French theory" was not yet a rhetorically circumscribed approach to reading and writing or an academic sub-discipline; the conference event now famous for confirming Derrida's international status -- Les fins de l'homme in Cerisy-la-Salle -- which Nancy was to organize with his long-term collaborator, Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe, was still four years away. This context is worth mentioning in reference to the 2008 publication of Saul Anton's translation of Logodaedalus because even as Nancy's book insistently raises the question of genre, it presents both its findings and itself in a self-conscious form indicative of an emergent intellectual milieu, albeit one still insufficiently characterized thirty years later with the tags of "deconstructive" or "post-structuralist."

Nancy's book is about Kant, or about Kant insofar as Kant's circumscription of the limits of reason exposes the problem, for Nancy, of how to write philosophy. Kant's attempt to create the blueprint or architectural outline appropriate for the presentation of his system, his attempt to remove his own inflections and present the critical project in a "style without style", are taken as seriously by Nancy as Kant's comments, generally reserved for prefaces and parenthetical asides, about the regrettable necessity of excising illustrations and examples from his texts or about printing errors. Likewise, the fact that, according to Nancy, no other philosopher has been appropriated by so many works of literature must be considered together with Kant's literary self-mortification. The nonhierarchical weaving of such different elements of Nancy's guiding question -- how to present philosophy? -- makes for both an extraordinary book and a disobliging one. Nancy is hyperbolic and deeply resourceful. In turns he is annoyingly elusive and genuinely effective in his identification of the way that ontology's transformation into exposition, in the critical turn, creates an ethos of presentation itself, rendering Darstellung one of Kant's underlying concerns, as well as the issue over which his system "syncopates" or blacks out.

To my mind, Nancy is at his best in this book when he attempts to show explicitly and textually where Kant poses to himself the question of presentation. Nancy is shrewd in tracing the way that Kant's acknowledgement of the difference between mathematical demonstration and critical exposition requires him to construct a language appropriate for the presentation of both the appearances and the categorial conditions or regulative framework of the system itself. If a little purple, Nancy is not extravagant in making his case that Kant's denial of literariness and his renunciation of its bent for popularity bespeak a certain preoccupation with the language of philosophy, and that the ultimate proceeds of his preoccupation reach clear of the usual truisms about Kant's dryness or tiresome style. The writing Kant inaugurates is an exhausting writing, Nancy acknowledges, yet it is also "writing itself," starkly concerned with its primary form and function (128); in its own way, Kant's writing is as severe and beautiful as a Gorgon (131).

Nancy also presents us with a Kant far more overwrought about the possibility of effective communication than seems justified and, more precariously, with a critical project that is subject to the charge, via its mode of presentation, of an intrinsic "weakness," "inadequation" and "undecidability." Before indicating why I think this attendant finding of Nancy's goes astray, I should remark on a few more features of Nancy's text. Logodaedalus (the title by which both Nancy and Anton refer to it) was originally intended to be the first half of a project that moved from an inquiry into the language of appearances to one about its categorial conditions. Nancy's Preamble and scattered comments in the chapters still announce Kosmotheoros as the forthcoming completion of this double act, and Anton provides an account of its intended scope in his notes to the text, as well as the clarification that Kosmotheoros was left unwritten. Anton also goes to lengths to let the reader in on Nancy's witty constructions, flagging several in his Translator's Introduction, regularly providing the original French in brackets and adding his own, bracketed notes to Nancy's. Since Nancy's primary text ambulates between scores of quotes on, or effectively in reference to, Kant (there is scarcely more than a page running of Nancy's text without such an excerpt), Anton also modifies existing translations or provides translations when necessary. Unfortunately, the meticulous editorial care is not extended to the citations from Kant's texts, for though Anton writes that he tried to supply the most current English translations of Kant, he neither does that (in a couple of cases) nor, far more inexplicably, does he supplement Nancy's quotes by providing the standard Academy pagination for Kant citations, with a few exceptions in the notes. At a number of key junctures in Nancy's reading, Kant's choice of words, both the metaphorical and the seemingly clear-cut, is of crucial importance, so the disregard for the standard method of citation forces the reader to go searching through Kant's German (or whatever English translations one has on hand) to find the relevant passage and lends to the misgiving that Nancy might be playing too fast and loose with Kant's language.

Logodaedalus is a name Kant gives those who "quibble over words" rather than contending with their grammatical regulation (Metaphysics of Morals, 6:206); the Logodaedalus affects the expertise of the grammarian with the same foolish pedantry of those who "address the public in technical terms that belong only in the schools," and all without even touching on the real project of the critical philosopher. Kant insists that the sole exception to the imperative that a philosophical teaching be made available for widespread consumption is "the systematic critique of the faculty of reason itself, along with all that can be established only by means of it" (6:206). No formal metaphysics -- by which Kant means no system that distinguishes the sensible in cognition from that which is supersensible but belongs to reason -- can ever be made popular. Reason is simply too precipitate, too headlong and desirous of resolution to restrain itself from dogmatics if left in full view of such excitements. The Logodaedalus misunderstands or intentionally misappropriates the responsibility and restraint involved in critical philosophy; he indulges his desire for acclaim, panders to the public, and brings ridicule on philosophers. Yet none of this matters for "the science," for metaphysics itself.

Like Kant's explanations about his decision not to include illustrations in the first Critique, his naming of the Logodaedalus seems nothing more than an aside (indeed, the word Logodaedalus is given only parenthetically in the Metaphysics of Morals and as a handwritten margin note recorded in the Nachlass). In a sense, the status of such comments as no more than asides is perfectly consistent with Kant's project: since cognitions are independent of language, no merely literary device could add anything essential to Kant's analysis of cognition; so in a crunch for time or book-length (the problems Kant cites), such embellishments can be sacrificed. In another sense though -- and this is a sense for which Nancy has as deep an appreciation as can be found in any Kant scholarship -- the very notions of the "architectonic" or the "schematism" reintroduce the issue of philosophy's presentation and return us to the question of the literary construction of the text. Even if we hold to the stated Cartesian-Kantian view of words as the "merely sensible" husk of ideas, discardable once cognitions are clear, the one who presents those cognitions must find the best linguistic vehicle to convey them and thus comes to deal with the persistent problem of managing his language.

But there is a gap, i.e., more than a well-timed syncope, between the awareness, beginning with Kant, that philosophy must take more responsibility for its own language, and the claim that the critical project remains tied to "a desire for an elegance sacrificed," a "captive" virtually obsessed with the object of beautiful, elegant writing (128), or that in resisting the temptation to show off his real genius in favor of the unadorned auto-demonstration of the system, "the kant ingeniously undecides itself" (114). Similarly, Nancy provides good exegetical reminders of the fact that while Kant eschews a certain kind of popularity, he both welcomes another form of popularity and rightly understands it to be, by definition, a matter of the potential for universal communicability that must accompany cognitions and judgments, and that results in the pleasure of communication. From this successful interpretation of Kant's (perfectly compatible) views on popularity, though, a leap is required to get to the point that Kant covets the craftiness of the Logodaedalus or that he turns out to be, closer to the end of Nancy's text (spoiler alert), the Logodaedalus. Nancy has his finger on a pulse of theoretical and artistic activity that Kant helps to provoke, particularly in the tradition of German Romanticism, and his handling of Kant's alleged "undecidability" would be a fair rendition of Romantic "irony" or Schlegelian "incomprehensibility" (which Nancy takes up when he writes L'absolu littéraire with Lacoue-Labarthe two years after Logodaedalus), but as a description of an inherent problem in the critical project, particularly one requiring the unique finesse of Kant's style-less style, the claim ignores the operational force of the idea regulatively posited; it thus neglects the autonomy of the critical thinker who understands that reason poses questions it can neither answer nor dismiss, and who therefore minds reason's limitations, implementing them in practical undertakings.

That said, there is something creatively bracing and interpretatively operational about Nancy's notion of the "syncope" in Kant. Outside of his prefaces and polemical writings, Kant does attempt to eliminate his personal signature from his work, allowing instead only for the system's "monogram," and he does in some respect become, for the generations that follow him, "the Kant" or even "the kant," a viable stand-in for the impersonal being of kennen itself, as Nancy plays on by varying the proper name of Kant, as in the quote in the above paragraph. The literary figure of the perfectly cerebral Kant, the Kant of the punctual walks and the dreadful prose, is a chestnut that is bound to reappear (Nancy might say) by neither accident nor anti-intellectual dismissal, but rather insofar as Kant seems to speak "for" Reason and in a manner so dissociated from our everyday musings that these portrayals have become an indispensable part of our coming to terms with him. This is a matter of the fictional Kant then, and a meeting point of philosophy and literature insofar as those unwilling to accept Kant's partition of demonstration and exposition from analogy and conjecture will allow figurative prose, poetry, and anecdotes to rush into the void left after the routing of lurid prose by the nonfictional Kant. Nancy does not mean solely to offer an analysis of the literary figure of Kant, however, for this is only one aspect of the probe that extends from Nancy's key question about the literary status of the philosophical text, particularly as it is syncopated in Kant's work.

Nancy offers the trope of the syncope not to suggest a rupture or an aporia in Kant's work, but to imagine a blind-spot and an elision whose effects continue to reverberate in the work. Nancy pictures syncopation as akin to the cogito; it is neither a negative movement nor a bridge, but the flip-side of consciousness and transcendental synthesis, which do not take notice of their identity until they momentarily lose it. Syncope means, medically, to faint; phonetically, to lose a sound from the interior of a word or at the juncture of two words (as instanced plentifully when Robert Plant sings "you need coolin', baby, I'm not foolin', I'm gonna send ya, back to schoolin'"); and musically, a rhythmic deviation, such as a missed beat, diverging from the regular rhythm (as when the steady pulse of Whole Lotta Love momentarily gives out after "Woman, you need …"). The French colloquial use of avoir une syncope, as Anton points out in his Introduction, has the figurative sense of "I almost had a heart attack when I heard [that Led Zeppelin was going on tour]." As a motif meant to raise questions about the ways that texts allow for sense and hold meaning, beyond their propositional claims, the syncope is related to the ideas of the trace and of the tonality of philosophical texts. (Derrida's paper on tonality, by way of his analysis of Kant's 1796 polemic on "A Newly Arisen Superior Tone in Philosophy," was the one he gave at the aforementioned conference at Cerisy-la-Salle in 1980.) Uniquely, the syncope is supposed to conjure the idea of something that, in momentarily withdrawing from some course (of consciousness, diction or beat), manages to "be" nothing but a loss, and yet a loss that preserves the difference between whatever comes before it and whatever comes after, neither bridging, negating, nor homogenizing their otherwise undifferentiated identity.

The idea of syncope provides a good oarlock for Nancy, who can translate and interpret something like "the proud name of ontology, which presumes to offer synthetic a priori cognitions of things in general in a systematic doctrine (e.g., the principle of causality), must give way to the modest one of a mere analytic of the pure understanding" (A247/B303) with "[The] thought that conceives itself philosophically … excludes the very thing that founds or structures it: a unity without remainder and the final harmony. Philosophy syncopates its own foundation: that is how it forms itself" (70). So transcendental philosophy curtails the presumption of ontology and makes epistemic good upon the feasible aspects of its promise -- insofar as the image of the syncope helps bring home this most central of Kantian positions, it counts as one of the ways that Kant hoped men of "true popularity" might render the truths of his project more poetically.

On the other hand, the idea of syncope as fainting, swooning, and blacking out runs a bit riot in Nancy's text, as Kant warned analogical language was wont to do. Again, what's really missing in the imagery of the swoon, even that swoon from which we recover to refreshed awareness of ourselves and our "secret art" of synthesizing, is the fact that knowing the nature of a regulative regime, qua regulative, requires focused attention, the discipline to delimit speculation about transcendent objects, and the command to use teleological judgments to orient thinking, within the regulative regime. Nancy uses the idea of syncopation justifiably when he looks at the relationship between transcendental philosophy and traditional metaphysics or ontology; he also uses it fairly when he analyzes the self-displacement of the writer, as a crafter of language, from his philosophy, as an allegedly transparent presentation of the framework conditioning sensibility and understanding. If a little more of a stretch, it is not unconstructive to think about the relationship between morally right but unsubstantiated, colorful and poetic narratives (à la Rousseau) and Kant's account of practical reason, as similar to the way that syncope, in its phonetic variation, can lose all but the auditory pith of a word. But Nancy's further assertion, also stemming from the image of the syncope, that the presentation of the critical project entails the "disappointed identity" of Kant the talented author and the subsumption of Kant the philosopher into the "violent logic" of the discourse to which he sacrifices himself (39, 94), treat Kant's achievement and any subsequent acknowledgment of the legitimacy of the critical turn as if they are inevitable happenings to be passively undergone once the machinery of "the system" starts working. Nancy's writing in these strands of Logodaedalus is at its most slippery: Kant does and does not renounce his talent, in "a somewhere that is impossible to designate", and it is "a decision" and "not a decision taken by Immanuel Kant," though "through this decision, discourse chooses itself as discursive [ … ] at the same time, it undecides itself because everything happens as if this determination, which is its own, did not entirely determine it, and it does so without remainder" (39). As I suggested at the beginning of this review, it is interesting to see this text of Nancy's emerging from its milieu, and statements such as those I've just quoted might be best appreciated as attempts to both resist and appropriate the concept of the "death of the author" announced by Barthes almost a decade earlier. But still and all, they fail to tell us anything about Kant's work and if they cohere (in a somewhere that is impossible to designate), then Nancy does not provide us with the means to pursue, test, or otherwise come to grips with them.

Nancy is a captivating writer and a provocative thinker. If there are several serious problems with the way Logodaedalus proceeds, these are at issue with respect to the deeper relevance of Nancy's identification of the problem of presentation in Kant, and of the attention Nancy is willing to pay to Kant's treatment of it, including in all that Kant leaves unsaid about his own authorial presence in the text. I think there are solutions to the allegedly resurfacing crises of demonstration and undecidability in Kant that prevent us from accepting fully Nancy's view of the critical turn, and I think we are justified in demanding that Nancy present his arguments more clearly, which is not to say with any less élan, if he means to write for readers not only of Nancy but of Kant. Be that as it may, Logodaedalus is worth the effort. It presents intriguing points of departure taken up in Nancy's later works and it conveys a sense of the movement in theory that it helped to engender. While it leaves several key ideas under-explained or overexerted, Logodaedalus also contains several passages of startling descriptive vividness. And Nancy returns us to Kant, insistently; even if we must clash over aspects of his reading, he reminds us that we are still articulating the full consequence of the Kantian project and still just beginning to address philosophy's conditions of creative possibility and critique.