The Disintegration of Community: On Jorge Portilla's Social and Political Philosophy, with Translations of Selected Essays

The Disintegration Of Community

Carlos Sánchez and Francisco Gallegos, The Disintegration of Community: On Jorge Portilla's Social and Political Philosophy, with Translations of Selected Essays, SUNY Press, 2020, 225pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN9781438480107.

Reviewed by Iain Thomson, University of New Mexico


Carlos Sánchez and Francisco Gallegos's collaborative book is a creative and impressive work, at once insightful, imaginative, and illuminating. Here three original philosophical voices -- those of Sánchez, Gallegos, and Jorge Portilla himself -- engage in a wide-ranging and often fascinating three-person dialogue (or trialogue), opening readers' eyes to promising new interpretive paths and raising surprisingly timely questions sure to provoke further discussion and debate.

Sánchez's increasingly well-known earlier book, The Suspension of Seriousness: On the Phenomenology of Jorge Portilla (SUNY Press, 2012), translates and interprets Portilla's 1966 masterpiece on "The phenomenology of relajo," Portilla's (apparently untranslatable) name for the distinctive comportmental attunement of those inveterate jokers who persistently reject all the demands and rewards of seriousness. The Suspension of Seriousness serves as the philosophical background forSánchez and Gallegos's book, but they helpfully recapitulate just enough of this background that the present work can be read as a largely independent sequel (albeit a sequel which will also draw readers back to the original). Composed of six chapters and three appendices,the book centers around three well-chosen and newly-translated philosophical essays by Portilla which help flesh-out his philosophical perspective and his vision of its wider application. Indeed, Sánchez and Gallegos convincingly present Portilla's rich, complex, provocative, and sometimes problematic essays as companion pieces to "The phenomenology of relajo," highlighting the ways in which Portilla's essays deepen his phenomenological critiques of social and political existence in Mexico and then develop closely-related phenomenological critiques of socio-political existence in the USA and Germany, critiques which, despite some blind spots Sánchez and Gallegos note, still read as hauntingly prescient today, seven decades later.

The book as a whole takes shape as an engaging trialogue in which Sánchez and Gallegos explain, interpret, critique, and develop Portilla's three essays in turn, relating these essays to one another as well as to Portilla's historical and political context, contemporary interlocutors, and central philosophical preoccupations. Sánchez opens the odd-numbered chapters with diverse and wide-ranging philosophical discussions that combine the insight of the leading Portilla scholar and translator with the breadth of an ecumenical philosopher who is also an expert cross-territorial navigator. A deft, surprising, and often entertaining philosophical guide, Sánchez does not merely survey the existing philosophical terrain but opens numerous hermeneutic paths through and beyond it, helping to chart the challenging and productive intersections, tensions, and legacies of the phenomenological, Mexican, and US American philosophical traditions at issue here. This is path-breaking history of philosophy at its best, creatively disclosing old worlds for readers to take up and explore in their own new ways.

As if answering that call, Gallegos responds in the even-numbered chapters by picking up on a few of the deepest issues Sánchez raises and creatively developing them in his own distinctive way. Extending Sánchez's earlier reading of Portilla as a critical phenomenologist of Mexican identity, Gallegos consistently refocuses the discussion by advancing his own reading of Portilla as a phenomenologist of our affective attunements and fundamental moods. For Gallegos, Portilla is first and foremost a critical phenomenologist who insightfully develops what Heidegger called the Befindlichkeit and Grundstimmungen of our Dasein or world-disclosive "being-here," focusing on some of the fundamental ways in which we "always-already" find ourselves affectively attuned to the world. Such affective attunements subconsciously but profoundly shape the ways the world can show up and become intelligible to us.

In Being and Time, Heidegger famously develops his existential analysis of Dasein's Befindlichkeit, our mooded pre-attunements or affective ways of finding ourselves, such as Angst, that anxiety or dread which Heidegger argues ultimately stems from the "uncanniness" or Unheimlichkeit of our existence, that is, from the lack of any single correct answers to the most pressing existential questions concerning what we should do with our lives, who we should be, or how we should live. In Being and Time, Heidegger suggests that what sets us free in the face of this ubiquitous Angst  is not a relativistic rejection of all possible right answers but, instead, a pluralistic recognition that there is usually more than one right path for us to take, hence his famous call for us to take responsibility for our lives by authentically choosing how to lead them. Heidegger notoriously fell short of this call for responsible self-ownership insofar as he failed to take responsibility for his own Nazism, but Portilla suggests a path we might develop in order to better do so as critical phenomenologists.[1]

A few years after Being and Time, Heidegger argues that our existential pre-attunements (or Befindlichkeiten) like Angst are related in complex ways to the "fundamental moods or attunements" (Grundstimmungen) of the historical times and places into which our lives have always already been "thrown" before we even develop a coherent self. Being and Time showed that a Befindlichkeit like Angst can help disclose the deepest structures of our existence by revealing our essential uncanniness and, in so doing, bringing us face-to-face with "the nothing" (that is, the dynamic glimmering of that which is not yet a thing) from which all meaning gets disclosed.[2] Similarly, a Grundstimmung like profound "boredom" can separate us from all our ordinary affective connections to things and so enable us to take up the perspective from with an encompassing grasp of the whole of entities becomes possible -- or so Heidegger argues in his middle, pro-metaphysical period.[3] This middle Heidegger even suggests that our basic moods or fundamental attunements can profoundly disclose the distinctive character of those complicated and dynamic conjunctions of time, place, language, and tradition that we call "nations."

Gallegos shows that Portilla picks-up and doubles-down on Heidegger's highly-provocative phenomenology of the basic moods or fundamental attunements of a nation, arguing that this ambitious phenomenological approach can be separated from the untenable metaphysical project to which Heidegger originally attached it and developed in a more defensible form.[4] Indeed, Gallegos suggests that Portilla's single most important phenomenological contribution is to be found precisely here, in the way Portilla helps us recognize how our mooded attunements "always-already" shape our most primordial understanding of our worlds and ourselves, establishing important but typically unnoticed parameters on what we take to be possible and desirable in the lives we live as individuals, communities, and even larger collectives like cultures, peoples, and nations.

Read in this way, Portilla becomes a critical phenomenologist of the basic mooded-attunements most typical of Mexico, the USA, and Germany. Those socialized into these historical worlds are profoundly but subconsciously shaped by the Grundstimmungen of Mexican Zozobra, US American "threatened innocence," and German "nihilism" or meaninglessness. Portilla's view, put simply, is that the Grundstimmung of Mexico is the profound Zozobra or "anxious sense of lacking an identity" that afflicts the Mexican nation, undermining all Mexicans' confidence and ability to respond creatively, flexibly, and collectively to challenges. Across the northern border, the US American nation is defined by a basic sense of "threatened innocence," whether this Grundstimmung of "innocence" takes the reactionary form of angry denials of all political guilt and reiterations of US American exceptionalism found in right-wing conservativism, or the inverted form of that (would-be) righteous obsession with proving the unending depths of US American guilt typical of left-wing radicalism. Germany, finally, is defined by its fundamental attunement to a basic sense of meaninglessness or nihilism, an anxiety-provoking absence of all ultimate meaning which, Portilla suggests, drove the Germans into their own reactionary embrace of a fascist strong-man leader promising them the simplistic reassurances of a restoration of greatness, the Nazis' murderous eugenicist ideology itself built on a reaction against the collapse of all previous fundamentalisms into meaninglessness. (All those socialized into these nations are shaped to some degree by their dominant attunements, which "can be evaded by no one," Portilla writes (159), a claim which sits rather uneasily with Gallegos's desire to exempt some of the groups victimized by the US American "White mainstream" (95) from Portilla's critique, a desire which seems to reflect that same craving for innocence it tries to escape.)[5]

Despite the seemingly undeniable prescience of Portilla's phenomenological critiques of Mexican and US American social, cultural, and political identity, I found myself convinced by Sánchez's ingenious suggestion (131-36) that Portilla's critique of the "irrationalism" of German nihilism is perhaps better understood as Portilla's vicarious critique of his own contemporaries (like Octavio Paz) and collaborators in the Hyperion group (like Xavier Villaurutia and Emilio Uranga).[6] At any rate, Sánchez shows that Portilla's critique of Germany is also directed against a pervasive aspect of Mexican identity, namely, that distinctive domestication of death which, although more existentially truthful than the US American "denial of death," nevertheless has also had terrible consequences in an exaggerated "will-to-death," yielding an "indifference" to death most readily visible in "contemporary Mexican narco-culture," where "death -- the destruction of the other -- has become commonplace" (140). Indeed, Sánchez's incisive readings of contemporary Mexican narco-culture point us toward the biggest issue their book begins to address.

What, today, is the best way to sympathetically understand and develop Portilla's bold phenomenological critiques of the fundamental Grundstimmungen of the nations of Mexico, US America, and Germany? Should we go along with his seemingly metaphysical hypostatization of nationalism, which risks imagining nations as substantive collective identities that are both real and separate from one another? Or might we instead begin to recognize the more complicated truths of our collective identities as (at least in part) all variations on a common human theme, different responses to the same deeper truth -- namely, the truth of that historical "death of God" which (as Nietzsche first recognized) severs our Western world from all its traditional ("otherworldly") metaphysical foundations -- an historical collapse of metaphysics which subsequently invalidates all attempts to ground some single substantive answer about how to live in an ultimate metaphysical truth and so permanently disqualifies all fundamentalisms (and so also motivates all those reactionary attempts by contemporary fundamentalists to deny this deepest truth of our late-modern age)?

I think, in other words, that there is a universal existential truth revealed by Zozobra; we human beings do fundamentally lack identities. "Uncanny" (or Unheimlich) at the very core of our selfhood, we cannot identify with some role the way a chair can be a chair, in some unbroken permanence or coincidence of our identities with our roles. Instead, we can only be something by continuing to become it, repeatedly transforming ourselves as our lives and situations continue to change. (That is a Kierkegaardian lesson Heidegger heeded well.) The deep insight behind the Los Dias de los Muertos (or "days of the dead") celebrations, as Sánchez shows, is that in everyday life we put on "masks," persona, and understand them as our "personalities," but in existential death all such masks fall away and the truth of Zozobra stands revealed. At the same time, moreover, there is also a deep human truth disclosed by US American "innocence," since, as Gallegos himself convincingly argues, "without a strong, stable, and coherent sense of identity," we lack the "confidence" needed "to take effective action" (53). Shorn of its rigidifying exaggerations (like the trumped-up con-man and those eagerly conned by his false confidence), US American "innocence" is a brave face put on the abyssal truth that there is no one right answer, and hence no righteous certitude about how to live, neither for the denier nor the critic. (As that alleged Native American adage has it, the left and the right wings both belong to the same bird.) Instead, as Portilla recognizes (in a passage Gallegos nicely quotes): "we construct our being out of a creation of possibilities whose foundations sink into . . . uncertainty. It is not strange, then, that human life, all human life, finds itself affected by an uncurable nihilism" (53, my emphasis). Indeed, as Gallegos himself rightly concludes: "As human beings, our lives are always poised at the edge of the abyss" (161). After Trump, moreover, no one can plausibly think of US America as immune to those reactionary temptations of fascist "leadership" to which Germany so horribly succumbed.

So, if all these phenomenological Grundstimmungen begin to look like different responses to the same abyssal truth of late-modern nihilism, then how might we instead respond so as to keep the promise of the future open to Portilla's call for confident action, neither drowning our hope in endless recriminations nor entombing it in reactionary reifications of some imaginary past greatness or trying to forcibly cage it in some singular truth about how to live? That is the largest question the book raises, and this is appropriate since, as Sánchez shows, for Portilla "the writer's task . . . is to create and offer a new vision of the world" (33). How might we advocate for "collective authenticity" while avoiding the problems that come from presupposing "some sort of collective or plural subjectivity that has a kind of [paradoxically collective] 'first person point of view'" (104), especially when it comes to trans-national human solidarity (let alone any broader, post-anthropocentric animal and environmental collectivities of the future)? Can the "experiential solidarity" that Portilla calls "coexistence" be substantive, or is it fated to remain merely formal or even critical? And if the latter, then how can we avoid endlessly reinforcing our own status-quo prejudicial echo-chambers, succumbing to that danger of thoughtless conformism which Sánchez articulates convincingly as "the terrorism of the social"?

Without pretending to know, I think the best way to give "dignity to our collective struggle to find the meaning of our experience" (161) may be to pluralize that struggle (into irreducible struggles), multiply that meaning (into inexhaustible meanings), and deepen that experience -- by encouraging more creative existential encounters with the abyssal truth at the heart of late-modernity. To abandon all fundamentalisms and build a more meaningful future on the far side of late-modern nihilism, such encounters will not stop with that late-modern nothingness of ultimate foundations but, instead, will learn to recognize this "nothing" not as sheer absence but as the not-yet-a-thing, the glimmering hints of future possibilities that beckon to be brought into the light of day with the help of all our creative disclosures (philosophical, artistic, poetic, political, and so on). That may prove to be the best way to cultivate and develop our defining traits and capacities -- and so come repeatedly into our own -- in that progressive collective becoming Gallegos calls "phenomenological flourishing" (150), a "postmodern" (38) perfectionism that avoids the stultifying distortions this book analyses so well. Can humanity learn to embrace the postmodern truth that, at bottom, we are creative and responsible disclosers of intelligibility, and so set out to multiply realize the singular postmodern insight that truth is irreducibly plural? This will, as Gallegos so nicely argues, "require that nations be liberated from entrenched affective attunements that undermine individuals' capacities to skillfully navigate moods and disclose the full range of meanings that the world has to offer" (150), even if those meanings, when viewed in a genuinely postmodern light, seem to remain inexhaustible and so, promisingly, always partly still to come.[7]


I delivered an earlier version of this review at an Authors-meet-critics session organized by the Society for Mexican American Philosophy at the American Philosophical Association, Pacific Division (10 April 2021).


[1] See below and Thomson, "Heidegger's Nazism in the Light of his early Black Notebooks: A View from America," Alfred Denker and Holger Zaborowski, eds, Zur Hermeneutik der 'Schwarzen Hefte': Heidegger Jahrbuch 11 (Freiburg: Karl Alber, 2017), 184-209.

[2] See Thomson, "Nothing (Nichts)," in Mark Wrathall, ed., The Heidegger Lexicon (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2021), 520-28.

[3] See, e.g., Thomson, "Heidegger's Perfectionist Philosophy of Education in Being and Time," Continental Philosophy Review 37:4 (2004), 439-467.

[4] As a Heidegger scholar, let me just note two related criticisms. First, Gallegos at one point (108) rather strangely suggests that Portilla's phenomenological way of conceptualizing "'world' and 'possibility' is not found in Heidegger," but I show the opposite to be the case in Thomson, "Death and Demise in Being and Time," in Mark A. Wrathall, ed., The Cambridge Companion to Heidegger's Being and Time (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2013), 260-90. Gallegos here erases the relevant Heideggerian category by substituting the practical world of readiness-to-hand (Zuhandenheit) for the basic "existential" structure of "understanding" (Verstehen), which for Heidegger is embodied before it is cognitive and so primarily designates those roles, goals, and life-projects (or Möglichsein that make our "being-possible") which we project ourselves into and so understand ourselves in terms of or through (by employing our various Seinkönnen or abilities-to-be). Second, Gallegos seems to equate Heidegger's view of death with "mortality" (44), which is in fact what Heidegger calls "demise" (Ableben) rather than existential "death" (Tod), as I show in "Death and Demise in Being and Time."

[5] This is understandable since, as Portilla writes (in a passage Gallegos also quotes): "Only on the assumption of innocence does it become possible to face the future openly and confidently" (116, note 5). See also below.

[6] In my view, Portilla's attempt to explain Nazism as German "irrationalism" stands out as his weakest claim. For, as Horkheimer and Adorno already showed in the 1940s, Nazism is not irrationalism but hyperrationalism, its murderous eugenic ideology propped up by a (deeply and multiply-flawed) attempt to derive all values from biology. Indeed, one of Portilla's greatest strengths is the way he combats the triumph of any narrow rationalism that would exclude all claims of the heart, instead insightfully rehabilitating the deep wisdom that our mooded attunements can help afford us when approached phenomenologically.

[7] For some of my own suggestions on this score, see Thomson, "Heideggerian Phenomenology and the Postmetaphysical Politics of Ontological Pluralism," in S. West Gurley and Geoffrey Pfeifer, eds, Phenomenology and the Political (London: Rowman & Littlefield, 2016), 19-42.