The Divine Lawmaker: Lectures on Induction, Laws of Nature, and the Existence of God

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John Foster, The Divine Lawmaker: Lectures on Induction, Laws of Nature, and the Existence of God, Oxford University Press, 2004, 170pp, $45 (hbk), ISBN 0199250596

Reviewed by Evan Fales, University of Iowa


These ten lectures argue that the only rationally satisfactory solution to the classical problem of induction requires the existence of the god of Judeo-Christian theism. Beginning with the problem of enumerative induction and rejecting the main responses to it, Foster’s thinking follows the following trajectory: First, he undertakes to show that the problem of induction can (only) be solved via abductive reasoning to laws of nature, understood as in some sense necessary. Second, Foster proposes that the kind of necessity exemplified by laws of nature is deeply puzzling. It is not the absolute necessity of logical truths, for we can envisage possible worlds that contain just the sorts of items that exist in the actual world (that is, just the same as regards their monadic properties and non-causal relations), in which the laws of nature are different from ours. Thus, nomic necessity is not absolute necessity, but a kind of contingent necessity. How are we to make sense of this? The third step in Foster’s argument explores several possible responses to this difficulty, judges them to be unsuccessful, and concludes that the only plausible account of the modal character of laws requires that they be regularities prescribed or imposed upon nature by a god who is the God of traditional theism. There is a bonus: that the laws are necessary only in the relevant contingent sense allows us to make sense of the possibility of their being “suspended” by God – hence, of the possibility of miracles.

This is, to understate the case perhaps, an ambitious project. It is engagingly carried out. One should note in passing that Foster sets aside, without much argument, a number of positions that, if correct, would spell disaster for his project. For example, he dismisses verificationism – which few will mourn. Rather more problematically, he rejects Goodman’s New Riddle of induction as involving a verbal trick – predicates like grue fail to capture genuine similarities – without working through the implications of that response. Thus, arguably, this response to Goodman commits one to a realist position with regard to universals, a position that Foster expresses grave doubts about later in his book. Further, at various points in his argument, Foster rests considerable weight – perhaps more weight than they can bear – upon certain intuitions.

To argue for an abductive solution to the problem of induction, Foster tries to show that induction is not a fundamental form of extrapolative inference. He considers a coin-tossing machine which, though known to be fair, yields a sequence of 100 heads. Since we know the machine to be unbiased, we should resist drawing the inductive inference that the outcome of the next toss will very likely be heads. Instead, as Foster correctly notes, we must take account of all our evidence – including our knowledge that the machine is unbiased. Absent that knowledge, we should of course infer – abductively – that the machine is in fact biased, and then infer – by way of a deduction – that the next toss will come up heads. So our inductive inference reduces to an abductive step plus a deductive one. But this is not clear. How did we come by our knowledge – in the first case – that the machine is unbiased? Might that conclusion itself require an inductive inference?

Suppose that, provisionally, we accept Foster’s nomological-explanatory solution, that inductive inference can be reduced to an inference to a law as the best explanation for a regularity, and deduction from the law. How far will that get us? One problem that Foster addresses only indirectly is that of the underdetermination of theory by data (e.g., the curve-fitting problem). Foster’s closest approach to this problem is a discussion of the concern that a law might retrodict a certain (observed) pattern for the past, but predict a different pattern for the future, which possibility he takes (intuitively, it seems) to be mysterious and contrived. But there are myriad other possibilities – e.g. long periodicities in alternating patterns – that are not nearly so contrived. Foster’s solution also relies on the further intuition that a repeated pattern is objectively intrinsically unlikely on chance. But such an appeal to intrinsic probabilities begs the question against the serious inductive skeptic.

Nevertheless, let us grant that laws do explain regularities. What are laws? Foster focuses on the fact that laws must be something more than regularities if they are to explain regularities; the “something more” involves, unsurprisingly, their modal status. More surprising is Foster’s claim that laws have a kind of equivocal modal status: they are contingently necessary (by contrast with broadly logical truths, which are absolutely necessary). This claim is pivotal: without it, the rest of the argument unravels. What is the argument for it?

Let L stand for the law of gravity. L, Foster thinks, is not only false in some possible worlds, but false in some compositionally relevant possible worlds – worlds that are populated by physical objects located in a physical space like ours, having mass and any other intrinsic properties that figure in L. That seems just intuitively clear to Foster; the only alternative he can think of is one that postulates a necessary association between intrinsic properties and powers or dispositions. And Foster “cannot see” what could sustain such a connection.

Here, of all places – for the issue really concerns metaphysical possibility – appeals to intuition are surely to be exercised with great circumspection. Foster ignores, for example – he is not alone – the idea that disposition terms might just be ways to denote intrinsic properties, fixing the referent of a property term by way of the causal powers it confers. (Fragility is whatever intrinsic property of molecular structure it is that makes for easy breakage.) In that case, the sustaining relation is just identity.

That is not, of course, the end of the matter: the deep question is whether the nomological or causal relations a property confers are essential to its identity. Foster does tackle Shoemaker’s version of that claim. But he misunderstands Shoemaker’s position, and his grounds for it. He thinks that Shoemaker’s reasons for maintaining the view are “verificationist.” But they are not. The causal-essentialist position is best understood as pointing out that it is only via the causal powers conferred by physical properties that we are able to fix reference to them. That is not a verificationist argument, if verificationism is understood as a theory of meaning (i.e. synonymy). Furthermore, if two physical properties were exactly the same in the causal powers they confer, they would be both indistinguishable in principle and, of course, play identical nomological roles. Conversely (taking property terms to be rigid designators), different causal roles across possible worlds imply distinct properties. So Foster fails to make his case here. If the causal powers associated with a physical property are metaphysically essential to it, then, intuitions aside, there are in fact no possible worlds in which that very property is exemplified but in which the laws in which it figures are false.

There follows a chapter in which Foster discusses another rival to his position: Armstrong’s view that causation is a necessitation relation holding contingently between universals. Though I do not think Foster’s criticisms of that view succeed, I shall not discuss them here.

Given this, Foster lacks the crucial premise he needs – the premise that laws are contingently necessary – for his argument that the existence of laws requires explanation, and that the only plausible explanation invokes a God whose credentials match those proposed by traditional Judeo-Christian theism. But the suggestion that divine action could bring about the laws of nature is of considerable interest in its own right.

Before he embarks upon exploring this idea, however, Foster considers the possibility that God just causes the regularities that obtain in our world directly, rather than via the imposition of general laws. God could make the world behave in lawlike ways without ordaining laws by simply producing sequences of events that exhibit patterned regularities. Adopting a dualist position, Foster refers readers to arguments he has presented elsewhere (in The Immaterial Self) for the conclusion that non-spatial minds can cause physical events, and can do so freely. As this is not the proper venue for discussion of those arguments, I shall here allow the claim.

Invoking mainly considerations of simplicity and comprehensibility, Foster proceeds to argue that the divine source of physical regularities would be a single being who is sempiternal, absolutely necessary, omnipotent, omniscient, and who, because also perfectly rational and understanding (objective) moral truths, is also perfectly good. Foster suggests, further, that it would be strange for a being who is responsible for the form of the world not also to be responsible for its coming into being and continued existence. It is, however, not clear why that should be strange. A good deal of the argument concerning the nature of God’s causal powers rests on analogies to human psychophysical causation. Humans are able to give shape to matter, and to events. But they are not able to achieve creation ex nihilo. Foster provides no reason, other than an intuition of plausibility, for supposing that God has the latter power.

Supposing the God has a choice between producing mundane regularities directly or by way of instituting laws of nature, what reason do we have for thinking Him to have done the latter? According to Foster, the latter choice, but not the former, would explain the dispositional properties of objects. We believe the wine glass to be fragile; that implies something about its behavior in possible worlds in which it is hit with a hammer. The existence of a law (with modal force) can explain this fact about the glass; a mere regularity cannot. That seems right, though it does not follow that the regularity view cannot explain what would (counterfactually) happen to the glass in a world in which it suffers the blow of the hammer. The (theistic) regularity theorist can’t ascribe a disposition, strictly speaking, to the glass, but can nevertheless provide a truth-maker for the claim that the glass would break if struck: he just ascribes to God a disposition to cause wineglasses to break when struck with hammers – i.e., he takes it that God causes the glass to break in all (or most: see below) possible worlds in which it is hammer-struck. Contemplating this possibility, Foster seems to take it that we know the disposition to be the glass’s. But it’s hard to see how we could know that. So it’s not at all clear, on Foster’s account, that the nomological view has an advantage over the regularity view.

But finally, what if God does impose regularity upon the world by instituting laws of nature? How is this then to be understood? It is not easy to say. Foster tells us that for there to be a law is for there to be “something which causes, and thereby causally necessitates, things to be regular in [some] way,” adding that “the fact of nomic necessity is … the fact of causal necessitation.” Moreover, “we would not have to think of a regularity that was causally necessitated in the actual world as obtaining in all possible worlds,” (pp. 156-7) – hence a law is contingently necessary. Foster distinguishes this case from that of God’s directly causing events in a patterned way, by saying that here God creates regularity by “imposing the regularities on the universe as regularities.” (p. 157) The difficulty is in seeing what this difference could be. What is it for God to “impose a regularity”?

At any rate, it is clear that this act involves God’s causing something to be the case. This creates a difficulty. Since a fact of causal necessity is identical to a fact of nomic necessity, it appears that God’s causing any x (whatever x may be) is governed by the law:

(G) For any proposition x, if God wills (or intends) that x, then x.

Now on pain of regress, it can’t be that God creates or imposes this law by any act of his. Nor, I take it, is this a law that Foster will allow to hold in some possible worlds but not others: it must be necessary absolutely. Finally, it is not a law God could suspend or revoke, in the way He can, on Foster’s account, suspend other laws for the sake of miracles. So, at the very least, it appears that Foster has not given us a general account of laws. Perhaps he could respond that G is not a law of nature. However, it is hard to see at this point why every law of nature is not an instance of an absolute necessity of the conditional form:

(G*) For any regularity R, R obtains if and when God imposes it.

Though I have been rather critical of a number of Foster’s arguments, I want to emphasize two sterling virtues of this slender volume. First, Foster’s writing style is worthy of emulation. It is extraordinarily lucid, and a joy to read. Second, the book treats some of the most interesting questions (to my mind) in epistemology and metaphysics. Even those who may not follow Foster in accepting the notion that laws of nature are divine creations will find of interest his terse discussion of the problem of induction, and his treatment of the metaphysics of nomic necessity.