The Domain of Reasons

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John Skorupski, The Domain of Reasons, Oxford University Press, 2010, 525pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9870199587636.

Reviewed by Hallvard Lillehammer, Churchill College, Cambridge University


The idly browsing reader might think this is a book about ethics and practical reason. It is not. This is a comprehensive account of 'the relation between self, thought and world' (1). It is an account of this relation that explains its possibility in terms of our a priori grasp of 'objective universal truths about reason relations: irreal, pure objects of cognition that mediate between knowing subject and known world' (504). Its explanatory ambitions are comparable to (at least) the first two of Kant's Critiques. Yet where Kant's eighteenth-century critical project delivers knowledge of the world by way of the unknowable 'noumena' of 'transcendental idealism', Skorupski's twenty-first-century critical project delivers that knowledge by way of the knowable 'normative dispositions' of his 'normative view'. The result is as historically rich as it is philosophically illuminating. Even though it does not display all the 'Hollywood' qualities of some recent works with which it will inevitably be compared, The Domain of Reasons stands on a par with the most significant books on reasons, normativity and the mind published in recent years. It is a 'magnum opus', and not only because of its size.

Readers expecting a discussion of contemporary meta-ethics might be tempted to stop reading at this point. To temper that temptation, here are some highlights from the book that have a direct impact on the hot issues of the meta-ethical present. First, contemporary meta-ethics has got itself into a serious muddle by confusing reason-giving facts (e.g., the fact that I am thirsty) with reason relations (e.g., the relation of favoring that the fact that I am thirsty stands in to my search for the sky-bar). The mistake of confusing reason-giving facts with reason relations partly explains the widespread, but mistaken, belief in all kinds of normative (including moral) realism. Second, once this mistake is exposed, the problem of understanding the supervenience of the normative on the factual is reduced to the problem of understanding reason relations. Third, the answer to how normative knowledge is possible is the same across the entire domain of reasons, from ethics and practical rationality at one end to logic and modality on the other. This is partly shown by combining a Wittgensteinian 'rule-following' argument against factualism about meaning with a Moorean 'open-question' argument against naturalist reductions of the normative. Fourth, Skorupski is heavily into 'buck-passing' from values to reasons (about which almost nothing below). If these headlines do not arouse the slightest bit of curiosity, then stop reading now. If they do, then what follows is a synopsis of Skorupski's view and some thoughts about how to evaluate it.

The Normative View

Skorupski's label for his theory is 'the normative view'. His case for this view is immensely complex and covers over 500 large and densely printed pages. Fortunately, the core of his position can be broken down into a small number of basic claims. These include the following four (509). First, 'all normative propositions are propositions about reason relations'. This is the 'buck-passing' part of the normative view, according to which such various claims as attributions of moral rights and obligations, descriptions of actions as good and bad, or beliefs as rational or irrational are all analyzable in terms of what is a reason for what. Second, there is a 'fundamental epistemological and ontological distinction between factual propositions and a priori propositions about reason relations'. On Skorupski's view, all a priori propositions are propositions about reason relations. These propositions are knowable not through 'receptivity' (by means of which the external world impinges on our minds), but through 'spontaneity' (by means of which we exercise our inferential and other normative dispositions). There are true a priori propositions, but these propositions do not have 'truth-makers', unlike factual truths known through receptivity, which do. Third, all synthetic a priori truths are (in the first instance) normative truths about reason relations, although some synthetic a priori truths have non-normative 'offshoots', which are non-normative universal propositions warranted by 'monotonic' norms (as in 'if P, then P or Q', which, although it follows from a claim about reason relations is not itself normative because it is not a claim about reasons). Fourth, reason relations are 'irreal objects of true and false thoughts'. Reality is a domain of causal interaction and substantial facts grasped through 'receptivity'. Yet normative truths are causally inert. So, even though there are objective normative truths, they are not about anything real.

In the following paragraphs, I spell out these claims further by focusing on five of the most important ideas contained within them. In the next section, I then ask what we are to make of these claims.

The first core idea is that of a domain of reasons. According to Skorupski, there are three irreducibly different kinds of reason; epistemic, practical and evaluative. In each case, there are three basic reason relations, namely specific (some facts give a reason for something), overall (the reason for something given all the specific ones), and sufficient (some facts giving reason enough for something).

Epistemic reasons are the main subject of Part II. An epistemic reason is either a reason to believe something or a reason to make a 'cognitive transition', such as to introduce a supposition, make an inference, or exclude a supposition. Epistemic reasons exist relative to 'epistemic fields' (the 'maximal field' is the field of all the facts). The domain of epistemic reasons includes norms of modality (reasons to exclude and include suppositions in eliminative inquiry), probability (degrees of reasons to believe) and logic (which is part of the domain of necessity). Reasons to exclude or be confident do not exist in virtue of the existence of real impossibilities or factual probabilities. The temptation to think otherwise arises from the 'tendency of thought to reify its own categories' (201). This, then, is the error of realists about modality and chance. True claims about impossibilities and probabilities exist in virtue of our 'spontaneous' normative dispositions to exclude and be confident in light of informed and mutual reflection. The basic judgments issued by these dispositions are 'innocent until proven guilty'. In the domain of reasons, common sense and the skeptic therefore do not start on an equal footing. According to the normative view, we are entitled to our normative claims until someone or something tells us otherwise.

Practical and evaluative reasons are the topic of Part III. A practical reason is a reason to perform an action, such as keeping a promise. An evaluative reason is a reason to feel something, such as blame. Facts that give reasons to feel something also give reasons to perform the actions naturally associated with expressions of those feelings (this is the 'bridge principle'). Thus, reasonable feelings of blame also make reasonable a range of exclusionary behaviors associated with holding someone morally accountable for their wrongdoing. Moral wrongness depends on the beliefs warranted in the blamed agent's epistemic state. Otherwise, the blaming response would be unreasonable. The bridge principle yields a 'sentimentalist' account of personal good and the moral attitudes, both of which are grounded in our affective dispositions. Yet other practical reasons derive from the spontaneous normative dispositions of people not insofar as they are guided by sentiment, but rather by the spontaneous dispositions of an impartial will. There are two sources of such reasons, the first being a principle of impartial Good and the other a principle of impartial Right ('the Demand Principle'). Thus combined, these three sources of practical reasons account for all areas of ethical thought (and more), in both its evaluative and deontic manifestations. As with reasons for belief, the epistemic basis of practical reasons is our spontaneous normative dispositions. Also, as with reasons for belief, our manifestations of these dispositions are 'innocent until proven guilty'.

The second core idea is that all synthetic a priori truths are normative. All our factual knowledge is made possible by our grasp of a basic set of synthetic a priori truths. Yet these truths are not among the factual truths. If they were, they could not explain how factual knowledge is possible on pain of regress (Section 6.3; see below). So what are they? The answer is that they are normative truths. These truths can be formulated as principles stating what is a reason for what, such as 'the fact that I seem to see an object before me is a reason to believe there is an object before me'. Being a reason is a relation between facts; persons; and beliefs, actions or feelings. Having a reason is having a license to move from one state of belief, action or feeling to another on the basis of the world being a certain way. All our factual knowledge of the world is made possible by the fact that we are able to make use of such licenses, at least some of which must be insensitive to what the facts happen to be. These fact-insensitive licenses apply to all our dealings with the world and constitute our basic a priori normative competence. This normative competence is not entirely empty of content, since it constrains the way we must take the facts to be. Because this normative competence consists in our grasp of reasons, it is true to say that we have knowledge of facts only because we have knowledge of reasons.

The third core idea is that reason relations are irreal objects. The real is that which enters into causal relations, or 'has causal standing' (30). Facts have causal standing. We can think and speak truly about the facts, but only because we can think and speak truly about reason relations, which do not have causal standing; so are not factual; so are not real. If follows that we can think and speak truly about things that are real because we can think and speak truly about things that are not real. These 'irreal objects' are the objects of normative thought and constitute the domain of the synthetic a priori. We should not think of such irreal objects as fictions of our imagination or projections of our contingent subjectivity. Their nature is independent of what we think it is: 'Their objectivity is the unconditioned condition . . . of the possibility of knowledge and freedom' (30).

The fourth core idea is that of a dual source of knowledge in receptivity and spontaneity. According to Skorupski, our knowledge is based on two 'epistemic materials' (29-30). There are the standard materials provided by the facts as they causally impinge on our thoughts in our experience of ourselves (in apperception) or of the outside world (in perception). These are the epistemic materials of 'receptivity'. Judgments of receptivity are true, when they are, partly in virtue of the existence of causally engaged facts to which they are responsive. Yet our knowledge of the world is not knowledge of the world just as received; it is knowledge of the world as received and interpreted. This requires the epistemic materials of 'spontaneity', or 'self-determining thought's own epistemic materials -- its spontaneous epistemic normative dispositions' (29-30). Self-determining thought determines itself by responding to norms (i.e., synthetic a priori truths about what is a reason for what). A spontaneous response is 'one that comes in the right way from, is genuinely that of, the actor . . . that is, from the actor's nature' (406). Actions, beliefs and feelings can each be spontaneous. Spontaneous dispositions need not be reflectively articulated (consider the laws of probability). Nor need they exist in 'harmony', in which case they may require reconciliation by 'free reflection on cases and consequences' (consider: 'every condition determines a set' (408-9)). All purely normative judgments contain a commitment that self-determining thinkers would endorse them in conditions of normative harmony. Thus, pure normative judgments can be defective either because they are shown to not really be 'spontaneous' or because they would fail to command the relevant kind of convergence.

A fifth idea, less prominent in Skorupski's basic formulation of the normative view, but just as central to his explanatory ambitions, is that of a self-determining subject. Agents are self-determining when they act from what they take to be sufficient reasons (508). Self-determination requires that one have the concept of a reason. It involves the reflective assessment of what one has reason to believe and whether one has reason to inquire further (this is 'self-audit' (508)). Self-determination does not entail autonomy, because it does not assume that the reasons to which one responds are reasons one correctly recognizes as warranted. Autonomy is 'an ideal of rational agency, whereby action proceeds from warrant' (506). The capacity for self-determination is a conceptual requirement of responsible responsiveness to reasons of all kinds, and therefore of all forms of normative accountability for getting things right or wrong. In particular, self-determination is a requirement of moral agency, for which autonomous action on the basis of a reflective grasp of moral reasons is a normative ideal.

How to Evaluate the Normative View

There are two ways of being led to accept the normative view. There is the easy way, and there is the hard way. I'm not convinced that either way offers a secure path from initial neutrality to acceptance of the normative view. Even so, it is well worth asking where we might get to by exploring either route.

The easy way is the way of explanatory loveliness. We should accept the normative view because it provides the best explanation of how we are able to think, act and feel correctly. One serious problem with this route is that some of the core ideas on which the normative view is based are seriously underspecified. The case is perhaps most clear with the pivotal distinction between 'spontaneity' and 'receptivity' that marks the distinction between the 'factually real' and the 'objectively irreal'. What exactly does this distinction amount to?

One half of the distinction is embodied in the claim that the domain of 'receptivity' is the domain of the 'causally engaged', or that which has 'causal standing' in a broad sense (the intended contrast here is that between a narrow idea of 'efficient causality' and a broader idea of 'productive power' (500)). I have one question about this claim: what is it to be 'causally engaged'? On the one hand, this category needs to be generous enough to include both the objects of our experience and the various theoretical postulates of the natural and human sciences. On the other hand, it needs to be discriminating enough to exclude our responsiveness to normative truths. Each kind of responsiveness allows for true claims of the form 'She believes that P because P'. Yet some kinds of 'because' are supposed to be 'receptive' and others not. How do we draw the line without presupposing the distinction to which talk of 'receptivity' is meant to draw our attention? Perhaps the answer is to be found in our theory of causation. As it happens, there is very little to learn about the nature of causation in this book (the index lists 13 pages out of 525 where the topic of causation is mentioned).

As Skorupski knows, the theory of causation has an interesting history, with some philosophers having described it as 'the cement of the universe' (e.g., J. Mackie,The Cement of the Universe (Oxford, 1984)), and others having questioned the idea of causation as a 'real' or 'factual' relation (e.g., S. Blackburn, Essays in Quasi-Realism (Oxford, 1993)). At least one of the basic arguments in this area is in some ways very similar to Skorupski's own argument for the irreality of reason relations. We experience causes and effects (compare: reasons and responses). But we do not experience the causal relation (compare: the reason relation). So causal relations are not real. So if we have knowledge of causal relations this can't be knowledge of substantial facts. Whatever the merits of this argument, it raises an important question about the normative view: what status does it assign to truths about causal relations (or other relations for that matter)? If they are factual or real, it would be nice to have an account of how we are receptive to the causal relation (if, indeed, it is a relation). If they are normative or irreal, it would be nice to have an account of how we become 'spontaneously' aware of them by exercising our normative dispositions. Either way, Skorupski offers us no easy route to an account of causation without a prior understanding of the distinction between 'spontaneity' and 'receptivity'. I'm not sure what view he does prefer, although given that the normative view is supposed to be a 'critical' philosophy like Kant's, it is tempting to think that its account of causation would be an 'irrealist' one (a temptation is obviously not an argument). If so, the way we draw the line around the 'causally engaged' would itself be a function of our normative dispositions. The account of 'spontaneity' would then be the key to the whole theoretical edifice.

The idea of 'spontaneity' is the idea of our conceptually articulated exercise of essentially normative dispositions. I have two questions about this idea. Could any of our normative dispositions (about morality, modality or probability) have been different? And if so, would the normative truths they are supposed to reveal then also have been different? On the face of it, the normative view would have to say yes. That strikes me as problematic, if not for all normative claims (perhaps a range of claims about value or goodness are exceptions), then at least for some (perhaps a range of claims about what is probable or improbable, possible or impossible). For these latter claims, it is natural to think that at least some of our basic normative dispositions could have been mistake. Or, even if the basic normative dispositions we have could not have been mistaken, we might not ever have developed those dispositions, in which case something must have been amiss with us. Yet this explanation seems to be ruled out by the normative view. Here is a possible reply: for the relevant range of basic normative dispositions, it is incoherent to even suppose that they could have been different. Yet if this is so, what explains this fact? If the reply is that to even ask this question is to put 'the cart before the horse' (200-3), then I’m no longer sure I have a firm grip on why it matters where you put it.

The hard way to the normative view is the road of necessity. We must accept at least the basic tenets of the normative view because these are the only claims consistent with the assumption that knowledge of the world is possible. The basic strategy will be familiar to students of transcendental idealism. Kant's claim was not that transcendental idealism is lovely. It was that it is unavoidable. There are several interesting arguments in The Domain of Reasons that might be thought to push us towards the normative view the hard way. Here I shall mention three.

The first is the argument mentioned previously about meaning and rule following (the relevant sections are 18.2-5). Question: what makes it the case that a linguistic rule is correctly applied to a new instance? There are two possible answers. One: the fact that we are disposed to so apply it (a dispositional fact). Two: some fact in the world that obtains regardless of how we are disposed to apply it (a 'Platonic' fact). Both answers are wrong. Given any candidate fact, dispositional or Platonic, it is always an 'open question' whether the term applies. But what if this Platonic fact were itself normative? Then the question would no longer be (completely) open. This is where the second argument pushing us along the hard way kicks in. For according to Skorupski, the idea of such a normative fact is 'inherently unintelligible' (452). If such a fact could exist we should be able to 'picture' (or otherwise represent) it in thought. Yet our normative grasp of the truth that a term correctly applies to a new instance is the grasp of a reason relation (of the facts making our linguistic responses appropriate). But such reason relations, as opposed to what they relate (the facts and our linguistic responses), 'are not themselves picturable' (452). So the Platonic fact could not itself be normative.

At this point, a charitable reader might reluctantly agree that Skorupski is on to something interesting about the normativity of meaning. Yet it is not obvious that the same argument applies to all truths in his 'domain of reasons', such as truths about what is beautiful or admirable, good or right, possible or necessary, or all the truths about what we have more or less reasons to believe. At this point, Skorupski offers a third argument to push us further along the hard way (the relevant sections are now 6.3-4.) This argument has the form of a dilemma. Either normative facts have causal standing or they do not. If they do not, then we could not know them because our only way of knowing facts is through 'receptivity'. Yet even if they did have causal standing, we could still not know them. We could only know them if they had causal standing provided we had a priori warrant for believing in the existence of the relevant causal link between these facts and our responsiveness to them. Yet no warrant for believing in such a causal link is knowable a priori. So whether normative facts have causal standing or not we could not know them. So our grasp of normative truths cannot be a matter of grasping normative facts.

The basic fault-lines of this chain of arguments are plain to see: our only way of gaining knowledge of facts is through 'receptivity'; all basic warrants for belief are a priori; all purely normative truths are a priori; no factual propositions are a priori. Skorupski will say that the price of denying one or more of these claims is either to lose our handle on a unitary distinction between what we contribute and what the world contributes to our thoughts about the world; or to lose our entitlement to the anti-skeptical claim that our thinking about the world is 'innocent until proven guilty'; or to imply an unwelcome commitment to some unattractive 'radar view' of normative intuition; or to locate our thought inside the external world itself in a way it obviously isn't. Rather than addressing each of these concerns in further detail, I will close my discussion of the hard way by briefly sketching two alternatives.

The first alternative might at first sight look like an obvious omission from Skorupski's book. On second thought, it might turn out to be a variant of the normative view. In the crucial passages of Part IV where Skorupski argues for a normative view of meaning, he considers the following alternatives, each of which he rejects: i) reductive realism; ii) non-reductive realism; iii) reductive dispositionalism. This leaves one possible view that he apparently does not consider, namely: iv) non-reductive dispositionalism, also sometimes known as 'response dependence without reduction' (see, e.g., D. McFarland and A. Miller, 'Response-Dependence without Reduction?', Australasian Journal of Philosophy 76 (1998), 407-425.). Why is this? There are at least three possibilities.

One: he thinks this view is not worthy of serious consideration. This would be an unreasonable response. Consider a limited range of normative claims, such as claims about what we have reasons to admire for being beautiful. True, those who believe that what fixes the truth of such claims are the normative responses (e.g., finding something admirable for being beautiful) of experienced judges converging in free and informed discussion are offering a non-reductive account of those claims. Yet as Skorupski agrees, a non-reductive account of normative claims could be true and illuminating for all that. Such accounts are therefore worthy of serious consideration for at least some normative claims.

Two: the normative view just is normative dispositionalism. To say that normative truths are truths of 'spontaneity' just is to endorse 'response dependence without reduction'. This answer should give us pause for thought. For not only does the normative view thus understood run head-on into the problem previously mentioned of accounting for the objectivity of the full range of Skorupski's 'domain of reasons', it is also much less theoretically distinctive than its presentation in the terminological garb of 'spontaneity', 'receptivity', 'objective irreals' and the like would suggest. So perhaps the normative view should not be thought of as a version of 'response-dependence without reduction'. After all, what would otherwise be the point of talking about 'spontaneity', 'objective irreals' and 'nominal facts' in the first place, as opposed to different normative responses to the world in different circumstances?

Three: he thinks response dependence without reduction puts normative claims on the wrong side of the 'receptivity'/'spontaneity' distinction, thereby wrongly making 'nominal facts' come out as 'substantive'. This is an intriguing thought. Consider the normative view. According to Skorupski, 'when I judge that P, I enter a commitment that inquirers who scrutinized any relevant evidence and argument available to them would agree that P unless I could fault either their pure judgements about reasons or their evidence' (498). This is the 'convergence thesis'. It is supposed to hold for all judgments, including purely normative ones (for which the rider about evidence falls out (498)). So we seem to have a truth-condition for purely normative truths in terms of convergence in judgment among competent and reflective judges. As a description of those truth conditions, this claim is itself normative.

Yet in any given instance there will be some non-normative way the world is that obtains whenever a given normative claim is true. Normative truth is possible because there are facts about people converging in judgment in specific circumstances. Knowledge of normative truths is possible because we have the capacity to be suitably sensitive to what would be converged on in these circumstances. Perhaps there is no informative way to specify these circumstances without using normative terms. But so what? It is in virtue of what would happen in these circumstances (however specified) that the normative claims in question are true. And it is in virtue of our knowledge of what would happen in these circumstances that we have normative knowledge. This does not mean that there are no important differences between normative and non-normative truths. Of course there are. But these differences do not entail that when normative claims are true there is never a fact that makes them true. Nor do they entail that normative truths, thus understood, are of a kind to which we cannot be 'receptive' -- even if such truths are ultimately grounded in our normative dispositions.

A second, and more radical, alternative can be motivated by pushing further the question about the 'receptivity'/'spontaneity' distinction mentioned in the previous paragraph. In a nutshell, what Skorupski does with his normative view is to replace a monist view of what we know (factualism) with a dualist view (reals/irreals). A third possibility is a domain-sensitive pluralism. Suppose (as Skorupski may agree) that we have no uniquely singular grip on the idea of the 'causally engaged'. We might then be prepared to allow for a plurality of different kinds of 'receptivity' to different kinds of fact. Suppose further (as Skorupski does agree) that we have good reasons to believe that different normative claims are importantly unalike with respect to their objectivity and other modal properties. We might then be prepared to allow for a plurality of different kinds of normative truth and different kinds of 'spontaneity'. Given a pluralist view about what falls on either side of the divide, we might then be prepared to pose the million-dollar question whether the distinction it is said to mark is necessarily exclusive. Could there be 'receptivity' with elements of 'spontaneity', or (as suggested by the remarks of McDowell and Pippin quoted on p. 487 in the context of a discussion of Kant) 'spontaneity' with elements of 'receptivity'? The reply will probably be that by taking this path we shall be losing our grip on the distinction between 'receptivity' and 'spontaneity' altogether, and thereby our ability to explain how our knowledge of the world is possible. That is another intriguing thought. It has been with us for a long time. Even so, there is genuine merit in bringing it back to our attention.[1]

[1] I am grateful to the Ethics Group at Cambridge for discussion of some of the issues discussed in this review.