The Double Lives of Objects: An Essay in the Metaphysics of the Ordinary World

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Thomas Sattig, The Double Lives of Objects: An Essay in the Metaphysics of the Ordinary World, Oxford University Press, 2015, 259pp., $60 (hbk), ISBN 0199683018.

Reviewed by Daniel Z. Korman, University of Illinois at Urbana-Champaign


A sculptor takes a piece of clay, Piece, and makes a sculpture, Athena. Athena and Piece coincide: they exactly occupy the same region of space. Since the one but not the other existed before the sculptor got to work, they must be distinct (by Leibniz's Law). And yet it seems impossible for distinct objects to coincide. Thus we get the problem of coincidence, the problem being that the following claims apparently can't all be true:

(1) Piece is distinct from Athena.

(2) Piece and Athena coincide.

(3) Distinct objects cannot coincide.

Thomas Sattig thinks that appearances are deceiving: all of these claims are true. Athena and Piece do coincide, they are not identical, and any objects that coincide are identical. In The Double Lives of Objects, he develops an elaborate framework, 'perspectival hylomorphism', which is meant to solve the problem of coincidence and a variety of other problems in material-object metaphysics by showing our intuitive judgments about particular objects to be entirely compatible with the intuitive principles that seem to conflict with those judgments.

Double Lives is a fabulous piece of metaphysics, and I recommend it wholeheartedly to anyone interested in the metaphysics of material objects. Sattig's framework is at once novel and familiar, taking elements of classical mereology, hylomorphism, counterpart theory, and supervaluationism, and blending them into a unique metaphysical-cum-semantic system that promises to do a tremendous amount of theoretical work. In what follows, I give a basic sketch of the perspectival hylomorphic framework, show how it is meant to resolve the problem of coincidence, and indicate some of the other problems it is meant to solve. I then raise some concerns about the framework.

1. Perspectival Hylomorphism: What It Is and What It Does

Perspectival hylomorphism is the conjunction of two theses: quasi-hylomorphism and perspectivalism. According to quasi-hylomorphism (the focus of Chapter 1), an ordinary object like Athena is composed of a material object and a fact. The material object is a mere sum of the atoms currently arranged Athenawise: an object that has all of its parts essentially and that exists as long as its parts do. Let's call this 'Athena's maximal material part', to distinguish it from other material parts of Athena (e.g., the individual atoms). Athena's other component -- a "K-path" -- is a sprawling conjunctive fact, consisting of facts about the qualitative profiles of different mere sums at different times. To illustrate, let 'a' name the mere sum of the atoms that we'd ordinarily take to compose Athena at t­1, and let 'b' and 'c' name the corresponding sums at t2 and t3, respectively. Athena's K-path is (roughly) the fact that a is F at t1 and b is G at t2 and c is H at t3 and . . . , where F, G, and H are qualitative profiles of a, b, and c at the different times. Athena itself is a mere sum of its K-path and its maximal material part (which, assuming that it is now t3, is c).

According to perspectivalism (Chapter 2), we regularly employ different modes of predication when we talk about ordinary objects, corresponding to different perspectives we can take on those objects. Sometimes when we make a claim of the form o is F at t, it is a material predication, true if and only if the mere sum that is now o's maximal material part is F at t. Other times, it is a formal predication, true if and only if, for some mere sum x, o's K-path includes the fact that x is F at t. Identity claims likewise have both a material and a formal reading. Understood materially, 'o1 = o2' is true if and only if o1 and o2 have the same maximal material part. Understood formally, 'o1 = o2' is true if and only if they have the same K-path.

Herein lies the advertised "double life" of an ordinary object. Suppose Athena has lost an arm. First, there is the life of Athena's maximal material part, a mere sum which never had a second arm as a part. Second, there is the life encoded in Athena's K-path, which includes a fact to the effect that a certain sum has two arms at a certain earlier time. The life of Athena's K-path underwrites a true (formal) reading of (4):

(4) Athena once had two arms.

The life of Athena's maximal material part underwrites a false (material) reading of (4). So there is a sense in which it did and a sense in which it did not once have two arms. (You can't hear the second reading? Neither can I. More on this below.)

Herein also lies the resolution of the problem of coincidence (Chapter 3). Claims like (1) and (2) come out true when read as formal predications. (3), by contrast, is to be read as a material predication. There is no contradiction in affirming that formally distinct objects formally coincide and denying that materially distinct objects can materially coincide. All three claims are true, properly understood.

This basic strategy recurs throughout the book. Intuitive concrete claims about particular objects are understood as formal predications and the intuitive general principles that seem to conflict with them are understood as material predications, thereby securing compatibility and avoiding having to abandon any part of our intuitive conception of ordinary objects. Many of the problems Sattig addresses are familiar: fission problems and problems of intermittent existence (Chapter 4), problems of permanent coincidence and transworld identity (Chapter 5), and the problem of the many (Chapter 7). Others are less familiar. In Chapter 6, he introduces "the problem of cheap indeterminism," namely, that the existence of distinct coincident objects threatens to show (too easily) that our world is not deterministic. In Chapter 8, he introduces "the problem of relativistic change," the problem of reconciling the fact that ordinary objects have their sortals and characteristic shapes essentially with the fact that they have radically different shapes relative to some frames of reference. In both cases, he argues that only his perspectival hylomorphic framework provides an adequate solution to the problem.

In addition to showcasing the problem-solving power of his framework, Sattig does a nice job situating his account relative to existing strategies for dealing with these problems, and he raises a number of important challenges for competing accounts. He explains how quasi-hylomorphism reaps the benefits of classical extensional mereology and Aristotelian hylomorphism while avoiding their shortcomings (§2.2.2). He shows how it improves upon temporal counterpart theory (§2.2.7) and modal counterpart theory (§5.1), while incorporating elements of both. He criticizes constitutionalist approaches to the problem of coincidence and, in particular, their usual story about why the coincidence of an object and that which constitutes it is supposed to be unproblematic (§3.2.2). He argues that quasi-hylomorphism is better positioned than its rivals to solve the grounding problem for coinciding objects (§5.2). And he raises important challenges for supervaluationist treatments of the problem of the many (§7.1) and shows how one can escape these challenges by putting a perspectival spin on supervaluationism (§7.3).

2. Why Accept Perspectivalism?

What does the lion's share of the work for Sattig is the perspectivalist thesis that the different claims we make about ordinary objects involve different modes of predication. The question is: do we actually have any reason to believe in these different modes of predication? Sattig offers two arguments in support of perspectivalism: an argument from charity (§2.3.2, §3.3) and an argument from empirical psychology (§2.1.3, §3.3.3). But I don't think either of them succeed.

The argument from charity rests on the metasemantic principle of interpretive charity, which requires that speakers be interpreted in such a way that their utterances come out reasonable. This is meant to include not just the utterances that people actually make but also "what they would say or believe, once implicit commitments of their actual assertions and beliefs are brought out in the open" (p.72). Since each of (1) through (3) fits this description, the principle of charity requires that we interpret these in such a way that it is reasonable to assent to them. But if (1) through (3) are inconsistent with one another, then it cannot be reasonable to assent to all three. So, the idea goes, the principle of charity favors compatibilist interpretations (like perspectivalism), on which there is no inconsistency in accepting all three, over incompatibilist interpretations, on which they come out mutually inconsistent.

The problem with this line of defense is that the compatibilist interpretations are also uncharitable in their own way. When we encounter the problem of coincidence, it seems to us that we cannot go on accepting all of (1) through (3), on pain of contradiction. The principle of charity is therefore going to speak in favor of interpretations on which it is reasonable to say that (1) through (3) are inconsistent. This is entirely reasonable if, as incompatibilists think, they genuinely are inconsistent. But, by perspectivalist lights, it's a mistake to say that they're inconsistent. Moreover, the mistake reflects a failure to understand some of the most basic and familiar aspects of our own language, the kind of mistake that reasonable people would not be expected to make. It's far from clear, then, that charity would favor compatibilist interpretations over incompatibilist interpretations, all things considered.

Sattig's second argument for perspectivalism draws upon the psychology of object representation (§2.1.3). As adults, our perceptual judgments about the boundaries and identities of objects are deeply bound up with our tendency to represent them as belonging to this or that kind (or sortal). Work by Elizabeth Spelke and others suggests that young infants do not track objects in this sortal-sensitive way. Rather, their object representations are governed by sortal-abstract principles, like Boundedness:

Boundedness: two surface points lie on distinct objects only if no path of connected surfaces links them.

Sattig suggests, plausibly enough, that the sortal-abstract perspective does not simply disappear after we develop a sortal-sensitive perspective. Rather, we continue to operate with both perspectives, each giving rise to its own distinctive range of intuitions and judgments. In particular, he says, "it is highly plausible to view [Boundedness] as forming the basis of the common-sense principle that distinct objects cannot fit into the same place at the same time" (p.101). Perspectivalism's different modes of predication are then held to be manifestations of these different perspectives (p. 102).

I have two concerns about this line of reasoning. The first is that it is not especially plausible that Boundedness is responsible for our anti-coincidence intuitions. Notice that, as stated, Boundedness entails that distinct objects cannot partially overlap. My head and my nose, for instance, are linked by a path of connected points and therefore cannot be distinct objects according to Boundedness. And yet we don't find ourselves with intuitions to the effect that partial overlap is impossible. Boundedness also entails that distinct non-overlapping objects cannot be in contact. For instance, the axe head and the handle to which it is affixed are linked by a path of connected points and therefore cannot be distinct objects according to Boundedness. And yet we don't find ourselves with intuitions to the effect that distinct objects cannot be in contact. It looks like Boundedness just isn't in the business of generating intuitions attesting to the truth of its entailments. So, even if it entails that it is impossible for distinct objects to coincide, there is little reason to suspect that it is the source of our anti-coincidence intuitions.

In light of these counterexamples, some may suspect that it is unfair of me to take Boundedness so literally. Spelke herself describes Boundedness as a "principle of object motion" (1990: 31), which is an odd label given what it actually says. But the label is apt because the real heart of the principle -- and what's most directly supported by the infant surprise data she is drawing upon -- is arguably something like this:

Boundedness*: objects move independently only if no points on them are linked by a path of connected surfaces.

Boundedness* implies only that coinciding objects must move together; it does not even come close to entailing that coinciding objects must be identical. So it would be pretty surprising if it generated intuitions to that effect. For this reason, Sattig needs the stronger, literal interpretation of Boundedness.

(As an interpretive matter, there is reason to think that Spelke really did intend the stronger principle. She herself explicitly says, "the boundedness principle implies that two objects cannot occupy the same place at the same time" (1990: 49). As we just saw, Boundedness* implies no such thing. Though it does rule out cases in which interpenetrating objects temporarily coincide while passing through one another, which is perhaps all she had in mind.)

My second concern is with the final step in the reasoning. Even supposing that Sattig is right that different perspectives are giving rise to the different intuitions, it's not clear why that should give us reason to think that the intuitions are compatible. To help see this, consider the dual process theory in moral psychology, according to which deontological and consequentialist judgments are the deliverances of fundamentally different computational systems -- the one more heuristic, the other more deliberative. Its advocates take it for granted that the tension between the judgments is genuine, often going on to argue that what we know about the different sources gives us reason to prefer consequentialism to deontology (see Singer (2005) and Greene (2008)).

Similarly, the natural lesson to draw from Sattig's dual perspective theory is that the conflict between (1) through (3) is genuine and that our having inconsistent intuitions is the perfectly intelligible and predictable consequence of operating with these two fundamentally different perspectives. Perhaps we should even go further, concluding that (3) should be rejected because its putative source -- Boundedness -- is riddled with counterexamples (or fails to support it at all, depending on how we interpret the principle). In any case, Sattig's premise that the different intuitions are the products of different perspectives falls short of supporting the general conclusion that the intuitions are compatible or his favored perspectivalist strategy for securing compatibility.

Neither the argument from charity nor the argument from empirical psychology is convincing. Perhaps the mere fact that perspectivalism solves so many problems while avoiding the shortcomings of alternative solutions to those problems is reason enough to believe in these different modes of predication? But perspectivalism has problems of its own, for instance what we might call "the problem of inaudible readings." In short, the problem is that perspectivalism postulates multiple readings of sentences for which we can only hear one reading. Indeed: we only ever seem able to hear one of the two postulated readings.

Recall (4):

(4) Athena once had two arms.

Sattig will say that (4) seems true to you because you are hearing it as a formal predication. But by perspectivalist lights, (4) can also be read as a material predication, on which it comes out false: Athena's current maximal material part never had two arms (though it was once a large part of a two-armed statue). Yet (4) seems true and only true. Try as you might, you cannot hear the alleged material reading. Even after I bombard you with claims that (according to Sattig) you will naturally hear as material predications -- distinct objects cannot coincide! an object cannot be bilocated! nothing can temporarily cease to exist! -- you still won't be able to hear the postulated false reading of (4).

Or suppose that, after flattening Athena, we say:

(5) Athena survived flattening and did not survive flattening.

If perspectivalism is true, we should be able to hear a perfectly sensible reading of (5) on which it says that Athena materially survived flattening and formally did not survive flattening. But the only reading I can hear is the one on which it is a blatant contradiction. (Cf. Sidelle (2010: 121-2) on counterpart-theoretic treatments of the problem of coincidence.) Similarly for (6):

(6) Distinct objects can never coincide, including Athena and Piece, which are distinct and coincide.

The fact that we cannot hear these alternative readings of (4), (5), and (6) gives us reason to suspect (contra perspectivalism) that we do not regularly employ two different modes of predication when talking and thinking about ordinary objects.

Sattig has shown us that perspectival hylomorphism promises to solve a wide range of problems in metaphysics. So if I am right that we haven't yet found compelling reasons to think that perspectivalism is actually true, there is only one thing to do: keep looking. I hope that Double Lives gets the attention it deserves, and I look forward to seeing it make its mark on material-object metaphysics.


Thanks to Renee Baillargeon, Chad Carmichael, Andrew Higgins, and Zach Horne for helpful discussion.


Greene, Joshua (2008), 'The Secret Joke of Kant's Soul', in Walter Sinnott-Armstrong (ed.), Moral Psychology, Volume 3 (Cambridge: MIT Press), pp. 35-79.

Sidelle, Alan (2010), 'Modality and Objects', The Philosophical Quarterly 60: 109-125.

Singer, Peter (2005), 'Ethics and Intuitions', The Journal of Ethics 9: 331-352.

Spelke, Elizabeth (1990), 'Principles of Object Perception', Cognitive Science 14: 29-56.