The DSM-5 in Perspective: Philosophical Reflections on the Psychiatric Babel

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Steeves Demazeux and Patrick Singy (eds.),The DSM-5 in Perspective: Philosophical Reflections on the Psychiatric Babel, Springer, 2015, 238pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789401797641.

Reviewed by Mark J. Sedler, MD MPH, Stony Brook University School of Medicine


The DSM-5 (Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders, Fifth Edition) is the most recent iteration of an unprecedented undertaking in the history of psychiatry that culminated in the publication of DSM-III in 1980. A project that reflects the work of hundreds of experts, panels, task forces and the input of professionals, consumers, as well as commercial interests could hardly have eventuated in anything other than "babel," especially given that the intellectual product was designed to achieve multiple goals and serve often competing purposes. At the same time, its remarkable, indeed global, success is testimony to both its effectiveness in achieving at least some of these goals and the lack of compelling alternatives. Any fair evaluation of the project must take place against the backdrop of the state of psychiatric diagnosis in the 1960s and 1970s, a period characterized by dogmatic psychoanalytically oriented theories about the psychogenesis of mental illness, a dated, unreliable, and mostly advisory diagnostic system (DSM-II), broadside attacks from the anti-psychiatry movement, which challenged the existence of mental disease, all alongside an emerging recognition of the clinical importance of biological treatments such as convulsive therapy and drugs that demanded a more discerning diagnostic process. In the midst of this daunting milieu, the stalwart architects of DSM-III forged a provisional nosology that sought to provide reliable guidance to clinicians seeking to identify and discuss myriad clinical conditions, offer a platform for treatment algorithms based on clinical presentation, and foster research aimed both at identifying root causes and improving the validity of the diagnostic schema, all while doing its best to sidestep the heated politics of entrenched ideology and vested interests.

The present volume of philosophical commentary on this ambitious project offers a range of contributions to the debate about psychiatric nosology, a few of which are truly outstanding. The essays range from narratives of the ideology and politics that informed many of the scientific debates surrounding the nomenclature to critical discussions of the epistemological challenges to the establishment of a valid diagnostic classification that could accommodate the diverse nature of psychiatric ills, even in the absence of known etiologies or agreed upon theories of pathogenesis. Of particular value are those essays that examine both the scientific merits and the extra-scientific considerations that led to specific changes in process and content as the document evolved over 35 years to the current, and controversial, 5th edition.

These include a thoughtful and comprehensive examination of the role of the "ideal of scientific progress" by Steeves Demazeux; an important discussion of the requirement that mental disorders "cause harm" by Rachel Cooper; a fascinating account of the debate over including a new category, "hebephilia," in the latest edition, with special consideration of its forensic implications by Patrick Singy; John Z. Sadler's essay drawing some interesting parallels to the "monomania" concept of Esquirol and raiseing some legitimate questions about the nosological standing of mono-symptomatic disorders such as delusional disorder, pyromania, or trichotillomania; and Jerome C. Wakefield's trenchant exposure of the confounded, and possibly corrupted, reasoning that led to the elimination of the bereavement exclusion in DSM-5, this being the clear standout among the collection's reflections.

In the opening chapter, one of the volume editors, Demazeux, provides a well-researched and illuminating account of the "ideal of scientific progress" as it animates the efforts of Robert Spitzer (DSM-III) and Allen Frances (DSM-IV) to create a contemporary taxonomy that would serve the immediate needs of clinicians at the same time that it fostered research. He demonstrates how previous nosologies promulgated by distinguished professors evincing their individual perspectives gave way to a classification based on the "best available clinical data," as compiled by panels of experts. Most insightful is Demazeux's tracing of two competing impulses that guided the evolution of the document over its successive editions, the "permanent innovation principle" and the prudential conservatism principle," the first striving to induce revision as catalyzed research produces new data and the second serving to maintain the status quo in the absence of compelling new understandings.

DSM-III famously resolved the acute tension between adherents of psychodynamic formulations and the new biological psychiatry by invoking an approach that is

atheoretical with regard to etiology or pathophysiological process except for those disorders for which this is well established and therefore included in the definition of the disorder. Undoubtedly, with time, some of the disorders of unknown etiology will be found to have specific biological etiologies, others to have specific psychological causes, and still others to result mainly from a particular interplay of psychological, social and biological factors. (DSM-III)

Clearly, Spitzer was optimistic that the DSM-III would stimulate research that in turn would provide a continuing stream of new data, effectively precipitating changes in the document in order to incorporate etiologies as they became known. He envisioned a process by which the DSM would be constantly updated.

But, by the time Allen Frances embarked on the development of DSM-IV (1994), it was apparent that research engendered by the new nosology had not actually yielded major new insights into etiology. At the same time, there was an enormous catch of new data about the reliability and validity of the existing categories. Rather than focus on innovation, Frances chose to overhaul the methodology into one that relied less on the consensus of experts and more on an objective, data-driven, process. The novelty of DSM-IV would not consist of a major taxonomic reorganization or the elaboration of new categories but rather the attempt to ground the project in "comprehensive literature reviews, re-analysis of existing data sets, and rigorous and extensive field trials." The threshold for changes to the existing DSM-IIIR was elevated and the outcome was inherently conservative.

In many ways, the DSM-IV is the pinnacle of the effort to develop a purely descriptive nosology. It achieved undisputed international hegemony in psychiatric diagnosis and became the gold standard in both clinical practice and research. Yet, there was growing disillusionment with the lack of success in identifying salient bio-markers or demonstrable causes for any of the DSM categories, and many mistakenly blamed the "atheoretical" approach for this "failure." Unfortunately, with very little scientific justification, the APA was compelled to update the document after twenty years and devoted an unprecedented $25 million to the effort. Demazeux describes with great clarity the chaotic process that bedeviled the efforts of the newly anointed editor, David Kupfer, to establish a "new paradigm" for DSM-5, an effort that sought to embrace innovation but ultimately retreated to conservativism.

In his concluding remarks, Demazeux contrasts "practical progress" with "cognitive progress," and he allows that DSM has made progress in its quest for a tool for communication and legitimizing psychiatry as a branch of medicine even as the atheoretical, descriptive approach failed to achieve epistemological clarity for its diverse disorders. In what becomes a recurrent trope in the collection, he questions without elaboration the appropriateness of the "medical model of mental illness".

Wakefield's chapter on "The Loss of Grief: Science and Pseudoscience in the Debate over DSM-5's Elimination of the Bereavement Exclusion" makes an important contribution to the verdict on DSM-5, whose process and outcome have been notoriously impugned by the editors of both DSM-III and DSM-IV as well as by Thomas Insel, the Director of the National Institute of Mental Health. The DSM-5 has been criticized from within the ranks of psychiatric leadership as resulting from a flawed process, succumbing to "diagnostic inflation" in order to justify reimbursement from third-party payers, colluding with pharmaceutical interests to endorse drug treatment for a variety of questionable targets, failing to safeguard against reification of putative categories in the absence of scientific validation, and thereby continuing to endorse a failed research strategy.

Wakefield evaluates each of three main arguments given by the DSM-5 editors and most importantly by Kenneth Kendler, who served as Chair of the DSM-5 Scientific Review Committee that passed judgment on the scientific merits of any proposed changes. These central arguments were 1) that the bereavement exclusion needed to be removed for reasons of consistency, 2) that the exclusion was responsible for false negatives in the diagnosis of major depression that would likely respond to medication, and 3) that it dangerously underestimated the risk for suicide among bereaved individuals. As he critically reviews these arguments from both scientific and extra-scientific perspectives, Wakefield convincingly demonstrates that each of these arguments was logically flawed, inconsistent with the evidence, and, most disturbing, corrupted by extra-scientific considerations. As a result, he concludes that the decision to remove the exclusion was "pseudo-scientific."

Whereas the overall quality of the component chapters is excellent, there are some missteps, the most egregious being an anachronistic argument by Stuart A. Kirk, David Cohen, and Tomi Gomory entitled "DSM-5: The Delayed Demise of Descriptive Diagnosis." It restates a discredited line of attack devolving from the anti-psychiatrists of the 1960s, most notably Thomas Szasz. You know that the discussion will be polemical when the authors invoke the "medical model of madness" (my italics), a term of great art in the redoubtable hands of Foucault but dissonant here with the generally serious tenor of the overall volume. The authors conclude from the fact that many of the conditions found in the DSM remain poorly understood that the "medical model of madness" is an "empirical failure." They go on to suggest that the "futile endeavor to validate countless human faults and suffering as medical diseases explains most of the 'scientific' conundrums and controversies surrounding the release of DSM-5," adding that "Despite DSM-5's insolvency, the essentially moral project of descriptive psychiatric diagnosis has today vast socio-economic ramifications that help to preserve it" (my italics).

These claims betray a profound misunderstanding of the formidable challenge that the DSM endeavors to address, albeit imperfectly. The actual reason for this "empirical failure," and the default conservatism of DSM-5, escapes these and several other contributors to this volume. The DSM cannot be blamed for the manifest failure to establish an etiologically based nomenclature even though some of its authors certainly believed (hoped) that derivative research would validate its presumptive categories. One need only reprise the Appendix of Karl Menninger's The Vital Balance to see just how thorny the taxonomic jungle of psychiatry can be and why "simplification" was so appealing an option when the only sanctioned treatment was psycho-analysis.

The chief epistemic challenge is that the categories of DSM are not of a uniform ontological type. (There are too many, easy, references to "natural kinds" and "carving nature at the joint" in these papers, as if the authors of the DSM are unaware that many of these presumptive categories are not diseases in the usual sense; moreover, these platonic ideas suit botany better than medicine. Even for diseases where the "etiology" is well established, e.g. tuberculosis or leprosy, causation is no simple matter of necessary and sufficient conditions, as continuous variables of resistance and vulnerability prove decisive in the expression of disease). Some of these categories are diseases (e.g. the psychosis of Huntington's disease, the dementia of Alzheimer's disease, a subset of cases of schizophrenia, bipolar disorder, and melancholia, as evidenced by their clinical homologies with demonstrable biological syndromes and numerous genetic and physiologic markers), some are disorders (e.g., alcohol dependence, bulimia), some are reactions (grief, PTSD), and some are mal-adaptations (e.g. personality disorders, paraphilias). The DSM's uniform use of the term "disorder" to designate recognizable symptoms and symptom clusters without distinguishing among their types is responsible for much of the confusion that arises when attempts are made to critically analyze a system encompassing so diverse a cast of clinical presentations.

Curiously, the most insightful approach to categorizing psychiatric disorders -- Paul McHugh's The Perspectives of Psychiatry -- is never referenced by a single author in the volume. McHugh's four perspectives -- the "disease", the "dimensional", the "behavior", and the "narrative" perspectives- are essential to understanding the epistemology and ontology of mental conditions. This is an enormous oversight and is part of a pattern in these "philosophical reflections," that they rely too exclusively on textual and contextual analysis and fail to reach out to the broader psychiatric literature on classification.

Despite the intent of some of its authors, the DSM-III (like its successors) is neither a "dictionary," as Insel suggests, nor a catalogue of "natural kinds." Rather, it is better thought of as a "field guide" that is useful for recognizing and communicating about the common problems presented to psychiatrists and other clinicians. These are not "problems in living" in Szasz's sense but rather problems in which the chief clinical features reside in the cognitive, affective, behavioral, and volitional spheres. This is the essence of psycho-pathology, and it does not depend on any particular etiology. The reason they appear in the DSM is that each and every "disorder" is encountered with regularity in the clinical domain of psychiatry and typically give rise to impairment in function as well as subjective distress. There is good reason for starting from the perspective of the medical model: not because all these problems represent diseases but rather because many of them do and because the medical approach is the most comprehensive way to sort them out, identify appropriate opportunities for medical treatment -- treatments that have been demonstrated to relieve suffering in dramatic ways -- and to organize clinical research. The fact that many, if not most, instances of uncomplicated "human faults and suffering" are commonly referred to counselors of all stripes for advice, support, and psycho-therapy is consistent with this model. But, when individuals exhibit psychotic symptoms, dementia, gross changes in personality, or a decline in functioning, aggression, suicidal impulses, etc., one can count with an egg timer the time it takes for these counselors to send their clients for a psychiatric evaluation, where a diagnosis can be rendered and all the "repressive" machinery of medicine can be invoked.

Again, this volume is recommended reading for specialists and non-specialists alike interested in the problems inherent in constructing any useful taxonomy of mental conditions and particularly for insight into the science, history, and politics that have shaped the current DSM-5. As companion reading, Sam Guze's Why Psychiatry is a Branch of Medicine (1992) and Paul McHugh's The Perspectives of Psychiatry (1998) are indispensable.