The Early Wittgenstein on Metaphysics, Natural Science, Language and Value

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Chon Tejedor, The Early Wittgenstein on Metaphysics, Natural Science, Language and Value, Routledge, 2015185pp. $140.00 (hbk)ISBN 9780415730396.

Reviewed by Edmund Dain, Providence College


Chon Tejedor's book is rich, compact, and ambitious. It contains provocative and engaging discussions of a number of themes in Wittgenstein's Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus that have been relatively neglected in the contemporary literature. Tejedor argues for what she describes as an "increasingly deflationary understanding" of Wittgenstein's treatment of several topics, principal among which are the self and solipsism, the propositions of natural science, and what Wittgenstein calls elsewhere the ethical sense or purpose of the Tractatus. In doing so, Tejedor aims to present "a new interpretation of Wittgenstein's early philosophy" (p. 1), revealing the limitations of recent debates surrounding the Tractatus that focus solely on Wittgenstein's views of language and logic and on a narrow range of influences on his thought (p. 7), and arriving ultimately at a new understanding of Wittgenstein's view of nonsense and so of what Wittgenstein means in describing his own elucidatory propositions as such.

Chapter one focuses on Wittgenstein's account of language and representation. Here, Tejedor argues, among other things, that Wittgenstein "dogmatically endorses" the ideas that sense is determinate and that meaning requires the existence of simple objects. For Tejedor, however, Wittgenstein's understanding of what these commitments involve is "surprisingly deflationary" (p. 16), but the full extent to which Wittgenstein's understanding of them is deflationary is something that only emerges in light of Wittgenstein's treatment of the other principal topics of Tejedor's book (p. 16). Here, however, I found myself unclear what, ultimately, those commitments amount to on Tejedor's account, and the extent to which they do, understood in this deflationary way, nevertheless have substantive, ineffable metaphysical content for her. Given that, I find it difficult to say how distinct Tejedor's interpretation is, in this particular respect, from readings that see Wittgenstein as attempting to communicate substantive, ineffable metaphysical truths by means of his nonsense sentences, and to what extent her interpretation therefore avoids the problems such readings face in explaining how that content is contained within and communicated by the propositions of the Tractatus.

Chapters two and three center on Wittgenstein's treatment of the self and of solipsism, and they are in some respects perhaps the book's strongest and most impressive parts, with chapter two in particular presenting a detailed account of the range of views that might be at stake at different places in Wittgenstein's early philosophy.

Tejedor's principal positive claim in these two chapters is that Wittgenstein ultimately endorses a conception of the metaphysical subject as "the totality of possible thoughts" (p. 75). The sense in which according to Wittgenstein we can talk about the self in a non-psychological way in philosophy, on this account, is simply that all possible thoughts can be expressed in language (p.75), and the "truth" in solipsism, that the world is my world, is simply for Tejedor the senseless tautology that the totality of possibilities is the totality of possible thoughts (p. 76).

The greatest challenge facing Tejedor's account here is perhaps just that of explaining the sense in which the totality of possible thoughts can be a conception of a metaphysical subject. What makes this a conception of a subject at all? What makes the application of the word "subject" appropriate here? Tejedor addresses this question much later (p. 150), but her answer there, which centers on the idea that the totality of possible thoughts is connected to the notion of good willing conceived as a matter of the disposition to use signs in certain ways, might seem unsatisfying, and this is one place where Tejedor's commitment to a deflationary reading of the Tractatus might seem to leave her conclusions stopping short of the more radical dissolution of the views in question that her argument warrants.

Chapters four and five focus primarily on Wittgenstein's treatment of the propositions of the natural sciences, arguing, among many other things, that for Wittgenstein scientific laws or principles are propositions that "provide instructions for the construction of senseful propositions within a given system" (p. 103), for instance, causal principles involve "instructions for the use of causal signs within a particular causal system" (p. 109). Our knowledge of such principles, according to Tejedor, is a matter of a practical ability, of our knowing how to construct senseful representations, and as such they are known prior to experience, and so in a sense a priori.

For Tejedor, the principles of natural science, construed in this way, are not themselves senseful propositions: they are instructions for constructing senseful propositions, and as such are neither true nor false. But they are also not senseless, since according to Tejedor's understanding of Wittgenstein's use of that term, it is restricted to tautologies and contradictions. However, although they are neither senseful nor senseless, they are also not nonsensical, Tejedor claims, since they serve a genuine purpose in connection with the symbolism. Hence, for Wittgenstein, she argues, there are propositions that are neither senseful, nor senseless, nor nonsensical.

Tejedor is, I think, right to suggest that for Wittgenstein there is more besides senseful propositions, senseless tautologies and contradictions, and nonsense. But one could argue in this connection that there is room in the Tractatus for a different notion of senselessness, one not restricted to tautologies and contradictions but involving simply a lack of sense. On that understanding, the propositions of natural science would instead be another example, alongside tautologies and contradictions, of propositions that lack sense and so are senseless, but that are nevertheless not nonsense since they are in some sense still a part of the symbolism. One benefit of that account, in this context, would be that it would then be possible to bring out more clearly and convincingly that there is already room within the Tractatus, on its own terms as it were, for the kind of account of the propositions of natural science that Tejedor presents.

Chapter six turns to what Wittgenstein describes, in a letter to Ludwig von Ficker in 1919, as the ethical sense or ethical purpose of the Tractatus. Here, Tejedor begins by criticizing and rejecting Martin Stokhof's "Schopenhauerian" reading, according to which Wittgenstein advocates abandoning one's desires in the face of the independence of the world from one's will as adopting an ethical attitude towards the world. Against that reading, Tejedor maintains instead that there is a much closer connection between the ethical purpose of the Tractatus and its elucidatory or clarificatory aims. For Tejedor, the process of clarification in the Tractatus aims at "fine-tuning our practical abilities in relation to the use of signs" (p. 145), as a result of which the reader is to come to use signs, or be disposed to use signs, in such a way as to reflect that "reality consists of fundamentally contingent facts", that "the notion of causal necessity is nonsense", and that "the notion that human beings are in absolute control of certain facts . . . is nonsensical" (p. 146). Using signs in such ways, for Tejedor, is to adopt an ethical attitude towards the world, and it is that ethical attitude that is promoted by the Tractatus.

This proposal raises many questions, and it would be very interesting to see it developed further in response to them. For instance, what exactly is involved in using signs in such a way as to reflect that (e.g.) reality consists of fundamentally contingent facts? Do all senseful uses of signs reflect this, insofar as they all express propositions that are either contingently true or contingently false? Do some senseful uses of signs reflect this rather than others, or some better than others? (Which? Why?) Do only senseful uses of signs reflect this, and not senseless tautologies for instance? (Why? Why not?) Can nonsense be used to reflect this (the elucidatory nonsense of the Tractatus perhaps), and if not, is it unethical to speak nonsense on this view? Do we have any choice about whether or not our uses of signs reflect that reality consists of fundamentally contingent facts, if that really is the case as it were? Mustn't all of our uses of signs reflect this in some sense, simply by being senseful, senseless, or nonsensical? Moreover, why should the fine-tuning of this practical ability to use signs in certain ways be thought of as ethical, as well as logical? What makes the application of the term "ethical" appropriate here, and how does its use in this context relate to and differ from our ordinary understanding, insofar as there is such a thing, of what ethics involves?

Here, too, it would be interesting to hear more about how the ethical sense or purpose of the Tractatus as Tejedor conceives it is contained, not, as it might seem to be on her account, in what Wittgenstein has written in that book, but rather, as Wittgenstein puts it and as Tejedor notes (p. 144), in everything that he has not written. Moreover, it would also be interesting to hear more about the connections between the ethical point of the Tractatus conceived this way and Wittgenstein's remarks in his 1929 "Lecture on Ethics", where Wittgenstein seems to suggest that in ethics the nonsensicality of the expressions we reach for is what is really crucial to them, and that nothing else, nothing that had a sense, would do here. Is that view consistent with the view Tejedor finds in the Tractatus? Is nonsense never what we want?

In raising these questions, I am not trying to suggest that Tejedor has no answers to any of them, or to others like them (for instance, she does suggest that nonsense cannot express this attitude (p. 150), although it is unclear to me why for instance Wittgenstein's elucidatory uses of nonsense in the Tractatus should not be considered to be a manifestation of this practical ability on her account). It is rather that what Tejedor does say in discussing her proposal does not seem to me to do justice to the full range and depth of the questions one might have here. As a result further development of her view in response to such questions would be welcome in order to give a clearer sense of what her view is exactly and how it relates to and differs from views such as Michael Kremer's, for instance, with which, as Tejedor notes, there might seem to be some parallels.

Tejedor's conclusion turns to the method of the Tractatus, and the question of what Wittgenstein means in describing his own elucidatory propositions in the Tractatus as "nonsense" (pp. 156-58; see also pp. 135-56). Here, her claim is that, for Wittgenstein, a proposition is nonsense when it lacks a genuine use or purpose. On her understanding of what that claim involves, however, Wittgenstein's own elucidatory propositions in the Tractatus, though neither senseful nor senseless, are not simply nonsense. This is because they do have a purpose, the elucidatory or clarificatory purpose of fine-tuning the reader's practical abilities in relation to the use of sign. It is only once they have filled that purpose that they then, in Tejedor's view, "become nonsensical" (p. 162), since they then have no purpose left to serve.

That account of nonsense seems unappealing to me for a number of reasons, but principally perhaps because, as Tejedor develops it, it connects the notion of nonsense too closely with the psychological rather than the logical, as it were. and as a result it seems simply to be false. For instance, my directions might help you to gain a practical ability to get to Providence from Boston say, but having done so they do not therefore become nonsensical since you have no further use for them.

Moreover, that account also seems to be false as an account of nonsense in the Tractatus and its role in connection with the method of that book. Wittgenstein's claim is not that once his remarks have served their elucidatory purpose, we will no longer have a use for them, and as a result they will "become nonsensical" for us. Rather, Wittgenstein's claim is that his elucidatory propositions serve as elucidations insofar as we come to recognize that they are nonsense. So Wittgenstein does not speak of his elucidatory propositions becoming nonsensical, relative to our abilities or needs, but of our recognizing that they are nonsensical, already as it were. And he does not speak of his propositions serving as elucidations and then becoming nonsensical, but of his propositions serving as elucidations insofar as we recognize that they are nonsensical: there is, one could say, one step here for Wittgenstein, not two as Tejedor makes out.

Overall, Tejedor presents a rich and suggestive discussion of some relatively neglected topics in the Tractatus. There is much of interest about her book that I have been unable to touch upon, in particular, for instance, its attempts to demonstrate the confusions inherent to the ideas of the thinking subject and the willing subject (pp. 56-65) or the self-defeating or "self-stultifying" nature of the idea of causal necessity (p. 98). But although the topics Tejedor discusses have been relatively neglected, they have not been completely neglected. It is, I think, unfortunate that throughout the book, and perhaps especially in relation to the ethical sense or purpose of the Tractatus, the discussion continues largely in isolation from the contemporary literature that there is on these subjects. Nevertheless, Tejedor's is a valuable contribution to that literature, one that is both provocative and stimulating and that packs into a short space an impressive amount of material. I have no doubt at all that every serious scholar of Wittgenstein's early philosophy will want to read and engage with it.