The Early Wittgenstein on Religion

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J. Mark Lazenby, The Early Wittgenstein on Religion, Continuum, 2006, 144pp., $120 (hbk), ISBN 082648638X.

Reviewed by Mark Addis, Birmingham City University


There has been a resurgence of interest in Wittgenstein's early philosophy of religion with Lazenby's book being one of several recent contributions to the field. It is a short monograph of less than 120 pages, excluding the index, and is based upon the author's doctoral dissertation. Despite the revisions to and development of the work which Lazenby has undertaken, its origins as a thesis clearly remain evident. His primary aim is to challenge the widely prevailing consensus among contemporary philosophers of religion and theologians influenced by Wittgenstein's work that his early philosophy is not to be taken seriously. The scholars who disregard these writings have argued that Wittgenstein repudiated his early positions in the later philosophy. Lazenby's central claim is that such a stance "misunderstands not only the relation of the Tractatus to the later work, but also the Tractatus itself and what it has to offer to these disciplines" (p.xi). He argues for this by endorsing the controversial new Wittgensteinian interpretations of the Tractatus (particularly mentioning Dreben, Diamond, and Conant) and applying them to the philosophy of religion and theology. Lazenby aims to demonstrate both the unity between Wittgenstein's early and later work via the treatment of nonsense, of religion and ethics, and of logic in the early writings.

The monograph is divided into six chapters. The introductory one addresses the biographical and intellectual influences on the early Wittgenstein and outlines Lazenby's approach to reading the Tractatus. In challenging the established scholarly position that Wittgenstein's early writings have little to contribute to the philosophy of religion, Lazenby considers how the apparently major bifurcation in the Tractatus between ethics/religion and logic could be interpreted. He focuses upon the relationship between the discussions of ethics/religion and logic in Wittgenstein's early work. Lazenby contentiously maintains that the significance of the Tractatus and 'A Lecture on Ethics' for the philosophy of religion and theology rests in the interpretative question of how these two texts are linked. His exegetical methodology is to proceed by examining the 'Lecture on Ethics' and then interpreting the Tractatus via it. However, this is a highly problematic strategy. Lazenby holds that 'A Lecture on Ethics' is generally regarded as Wittgenstein's early work. This is disputable as the 'Lecture' dates from his return to philosophy in 1929 with the result that many Wittgenstein scholars would view it as belonging to the start of the middle period. Although the 'Lecture' has clear affinities with the Tractatus this does not justify the position that it is an early work. There are also a number of interpretative difficulties that arise from the former's status as a popular lecture. The 'Lecture' cannot be straightforwardly invoked to justify particular readings of the Tractatus. Lazenby contends that the new Wittgensteinian reading of the Tractatus offers a way of providing a satisfactory connection between discussions of ethics/religion and logic. The new Wittgensteinian interpretation of the Tractatus was briefly popular. It was strongly criticised with the result that it fell out of favour. The majority of Wittgenstein scholarship regards it as giving an implausible reading of the text. In so far as this interpretation is unsatisfactory so is much of Lazenby's account. Lazenby supports the view that Wittgenstein thought that the point of the Tractatus was ethical and criticises Hacker (as a particular representative of that general way of thinking) for dismissing this claim. Critiques of the new Wittgensteinian perspective and detailed consideration of the mentions of ethics pertaining to the Tractatus strongly suggest that Hacker's type of view should be preferred. Lazenby invokes an unconvincing analogy when he approvingly cites Friedlander's claim that the seven parts of the Tractatus are analogous to the seven days of creation (p.2). The problem is that just because an analogy can be postulated it does not follow that it is valid. Lazenby favours the biographical and intellectual influences on the early Wittgenstein found in Janik and Toulmin's Wittgenstein's Vienna but makes it clear that such considerations can have only a strictly limited role when it comes to matters of textual interpretation. For Lazenby, resolving the question of how what nonsensical propositions try to say is shown "unlocks the relation of the logical discussion to the religious discussion in the Tractatus" (p.8). Proceeding from this his interpretation of the text revolves around the issues of what its mysticism is and what constitutes nonsense in it.

Chapter two is concerned with what Lazenby terms the force of words. In it he reads the 'Lecture on Ethics' against Moore's Principia Ethica, Logical Positivism, and word-verificationism arguing that in each case the propositions of ethics and religion remain nonsensical. Given the positions with which he contrasts the 'Lecture', it is straightforward to arrive at his conclusion. However, this discussion does not contribute towards increasing the persuasiveness of new Wittgensteinian interpretation. According to Lazenby "the meaning of a word in religious and ethical statements consists in its contribution to the act effected by the statements in which that word occurs" (p.34) and this contribution is what he calls the force of words. He claims to be directly or indirectly indebted to Wittgenstein's idea of meaning as use for the idea of the force of words. It is possible to make this argument but it is by no means obvious that it is a natural way to develop the notion of meaning as use. Lazenby holds that the central notion of the 'Lecture' is that the meaning of ethical and religious expressions is to be sought in an examination of the force of words in the lives of their users. This view would benefit from further substantiation and could receive it from the idea found in Wittgenstein's later work that religious belief is a passionate commitment to a system of reference. However, taking this approach appears to diminish the special significance of the earlier work.

The third chapter is concerned with the notion of being limited to a common language in the Tractatus and the implications of this for ethics and religion. Lazenby explores the book's mysticism, contending that although logical propositions are the means through which Wittgenstein can have mystic union such propositions are not factual. He draws the conclusion that if the Tractatus is to have any force Wittgenstein must be silent (p.37). Lazenby objects to McGuinness's view that Wittgenstein is a nature mystic in the Tractatus and argues that he is actually a theistic mystic. He claims that it is essential to realise that there are two worlds in Tractatus, namely the factual and the spiritual, in order to understand how there can be value inside the world. Lazenby develops this position by arguing that the factual world is the everyday one which logic characterises and that value lies outside this world. The mystic looks back upon this world once it has been transcended but after this has happened there is nothing to say and hence silence ensues.

Chapter four is about reconstructing meanings and partially stems from the issue of what should be done with words employed in ethical and religious expressions which are not understood in a common language. For Lazenby a motivation of this inquiry is the problem facing contemporary philosophy of religion and theology of whether "there is room for religious uses of language in today's real world" (p.64). If the current meanings of the words do not cohere with the aim of everyday living (which was associated with the original meaning of the words) then meanings that do should be found. Lazenby follows the new Wittgensteinian approach to nonsense in the Tractatus, considering Diamond and Conant's therapeutic interpretation and some of its problems. He adopts a stance which he regards as being between that of Anscombe, Geach, and Pears, and that of Diamond and Conant, namely, that the Tractatus contains both the important forms of ethical and religious nonsense, and the confused nonsense stemming from logic. Lazenby contends that to limit our speech to the factual ensures that no facts in life are meaningless. Ascribing meaning to the facts "is an act in life" and in "its own way, a sort of speech act" (p.79). Agreement between behaviour and use must be forced in the reconstruction of the meanings of words.

The fifth chapter continues the application of the concept of force to the philosophy of religion and theology. Lazenby argues that theologians must give force to the words employed in theology. When ethical and religious expressions are not part of a common language they should be reconstructed to make them intelligible within the common language. Reconstruction of this kind ensures that the meanings of religious statements are consonant with the lives and utterances of believers. Lazenby's treatment of the idea of a religious way of life and the usage of pictures to express religious beliefs has close affinities with Wittgenstein's view that religious belief is a passionate commitment to a system of reference. His claims here would be better justified on that ground and it is evident that his invocation of the early work adds very little argumentative strength. Lazenby holds that "theology is an activity of understanding how believers communicate in a religious practice" (p.89). What is required is discerning how communication can be reconstructed to further positive change in the ongoing action of which it is a part. Chapter 6 was evidently the concluding chapter of the dissertation and is simply a summary of the previous arguments presented. As such it does not really contribute anything to the book and could have been omitted without particular loss.

Lazenby's monograph is well written with a wide range of references but his overall position is unpersuasive. Although the philosophical discussions are very largely reasonable in themselves they are ultimately disappointing primarily because of the shortcomings of the new Wittgensteinian interpretative framework. A book this short is expensive at $120.