The Economy of the Earth: Philosophy, Law, and the Environment, 2nd edition

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Mark Sagoff, The Economy of the Earth: Philosophy, Law, and the Environment, 2nd edition, Cambridge UP, 2008, 266pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521687133.

Reviewed by John O'Neill, University of Manchester



The first edition of The Economy of the Earth was a highly influential contribution to the debates on the economic valuation of environmental goods. Its central aim was to reject market-mimicking mechanisms such as cost-benefit analysis as appropriate procedures for public decision-making about environmental choices. The attempt to capture environmental values through monetary valuation treats the preferences that an individual has as a citizen as being of the same kind as those she has as a consumer. Both, it is assumed, can be measured by an individual’s willingness to pay for the good at the margin. This approach, Sagoff suggested, is founded on a category mistake, confusing private desires with public judgements. The public ‘preferences’ an individual expresses as a citizen are statements of belief about the good of the community which are open to reasoned argument. What matters in public debate is not the intensity of private preferences for or against some option, but the persuasiveness of public reasons offered for them. This cannot be captured by an individual’s willingness to pay, which merely expresses the intensity of the individual’s desires for particular goods that satisfy private interests. Environmental policy needs to answer to public democratic debate, not to mechanisms borrowed from the market. In developing this argument Sagoff employed a series of contrasts: between the citizen and the consumer; between moral and aesthetic judgements on the one hand and consumer preferences on the other; between the values that represent what the individual believes to be good or right for the community, and the preferences the individual entertains about his or her consumption opportunities; between political institutions and processes, and market institutions and processes; between the opposition of ideas and differences of interest; between reasoned argument and market exchange. These arguments were developed with clarity in the early chapters of the first edition and two of these chapters are retained as chapters 2 and 3 in the new edition. The arguments of these chapters remain important and retain their relevance: the practices of contingent valuation and cost-benefit analysis still remain central policy instruments in environmental decision-making. Most of the remaining chapters of the second edition are, however, almost entirely new. One way of understanding their implications lies in the way they place Sagoff’s criticism of market-mimicking public choices in a longer standing debate about the relation of markets and politics.

Criticism of the extension of market-mimicking methods to environmental choices is consistent with a number of different positions about the proper relation between, and the relative scope of, markets and politics. Both market-sceptical and market-friendly positions are consistent with the criticism. Thus on the one hand, there are more market-sceptical positions, which have their origins in the socialist tradition, which question more generally the degree to which unfettered markets can issue in environmentally benign outcomes. Within the tradition there are degrees to which such scepticism extends: there are those such as the logical empiricist Otto Neurath who aimed at ultimately replacing markets with non-market economic institutions and decision-making procedures which deal not in monetary measures but directly with physical, environmental and social measures of welfare (O’Neill, 1999, 2004); there are others such as Karl Polanyi who aimed primarily at re-embedding markets within social and environmental norms (O’Neill, 2007, chapter 1.). On the other hand, there are market-friendly positions, especially from within the Austrian tradition, which are sceptical not of markets, but rather of politics and the possibility of political procedures mimicking markets. The only prices that matter are those prices that are actually arrived at through market exchange, which coordinates the actions of independent property-holding agents.

Economic calculation cannot comprehend things which are not sold and bought against money. There are things which are not for sale and for whose acquisition sacrifices other than money and money’s worth must be expended… . There are things which cannot at all be evaluated in money, and there are other things which can be appraised in money only with regard to a fraction of the value assigned to them. The appraisal of an old building must disregard its artistic and historical eminence as far as these qualities are not a source of proceeds in money or goods vendible … However, all this does not in the least impair the usefulness of economic calculation … All that acting man needs in order to make his choice is to contrast them with the total amount of costs their acquisition or preservation requires. (Mises, 1949, chapter 12.2)

In making political choices about non-market goods, one can know the opportunity costs of a project, but no more. Politics cannot second guess the market. If markets are to play a role in environmental choices it is through the extension of property rights to environmental goods so that they can be assigned an actual market price. The criticism of the possibility of market-mimicking procedures in politics mattered in the Austrian tradition since the possibility of the use of such procedures by the state had been central to the kind of market socialist planning of writers such as Lange. However the account is critical not just of market-mimicking procedures in politics, but also of that variety of perspectives in the tradition of Neurath and ecological economics that aims either to replace or to supplement their use with non-market measures of welfare.

Mark Sagoff does not outline this larger debate. However, in the new chapters of the book Sagoff carves out a particular version of the Austrian position. His account of politics is wider in scope and more deliberative than that which is usually found within the Austrian tradition. The role of politics on this account is to articulate the public values of citizens and express those values in law. However, when it comes to the scepticism about market-mimicking procedures he appeals both to an Austrian view of the role of markets in determining meaningful prices and an Austrian view of the virtues of the markets. More specifically he endorses a version of a Hayekian position according to which the role of market prices is to coordinate the actions of agents, not to value the worth of a good. The price mechanism is a solution to the problem of the division of knowledge in society — the dispersal of local and practical knowledge among agents. Price serves as a measure of changes in the relation between the supply and demand for goods. As such, it communicates between actors that information which is required for the coordination of their activities. Thus he writes of the Austrian view:

According to this approach, the economic problem is one of coordination in relation to information implicit in prices, rather than one of valuation in relation to a conception of the good defined as WTP [willingness to pay] within economic science. The problem for economic theory is not to posit and then measure “value” as an intrinsic quantity, whether as labor surplus (as Smith and Marx believed) or as consumer surplus (as is assumed today). It is to analyze how the spontaneous interaction of a number of people, each possessing only bits of knowledge, brings about a state of affairs in which prices correspond to costs, etc. and which could be brought about by deliberate direction only by someone who possessed the combined knowledge of all those individuals. [F. A. Hayek Individualism and Economic Order (Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1948) p. 50] (pp. 80-81)

It is this approach that Sagoff endorses:

I agree, then, with the Austrian school of thought that believes that economists should focus on two concerns. The first is to explain the nuances of Smith’s invisible hand… . To understand the Invisible Hand is to recognize that goods do not exist in fixed or static amounts to be allocated and consumed by those who “value” them most. Instead, in the appropriate competitive conditions — conditions in which price signals convey information about such things as scarcity — economic activity is creative and dynamic. The second task is to throw cold water on utopian schemes by reminding their partisans how feckless, horrid, recalcitrant, truculent, exasperating, and depressing human nature truly is. (p. 93)

Many Austrians have extended Hayek’s epistemic arguments against markets to mount a wider criticism of deliberative approaches to environmental policy on the grounds that it necessarily excludes practical and tacit knowledge that cannot be articulated in propositional form (Pennington, 2001, 2003). In contrast, Sagoff’s own particular position in the history of these debates is to combine an Austrian picture of the nature and virtues of the market with a largely non-Austrian view of politics as the realm in which public and shared moral and aesthetic values both can and should be articulated and enacted in public law after due deliberation.

This particular combination of an Austrian view of markets and a deliberative view of politics underpins his ambiguous relationship to other versions of environmentalism.

On the one hand, Sagoff defends those environmental arguments that appeal to moral, spiritual and aesthetic values. The defence is developed with particular sensitivity in an excellent discussion of the concept of place in environmental ethics. His discussions of the role of environmental goods in the national culture of the United States and of religion’s role in environmentalism in that context call upon the same view of politics, although, for at least this secular European, they were less compelling. Questions of the shared values of public communities and questions of national culture and identity can and should be kept distinct (O’Neill, 1994). On the other hand, Sagoff is sceptical of those environmental arguments that appeal to physical limits to economic activity and consumption. While defending the claim that certain kinds of increasing consumption can be criticised for not being good for us, he rejects the view that there are physical or ecological limits to either increasing consumption or growing population (p. 132ff.). Neither renewable nor non-renewable resources, be it minerals, food or energy, place any limits on human consumption in modern market economies. Sagoff defends the claims that resource constraints are largely a function of technology, and that as technology advances apparent resource limits recede. At the same time technology can enable us to have less energy intensive consumption with lower emissions in greenhouse gases. Goods will become lighter, smaller and less energy intensive. The market released from distortions of subsidies can deliver such technologies (p. 125).

How convincing is this position? Here I should come clean — I belong to those critics of market-mimicking procedures in environmental decision-making that emerges from the more market-sceptical positions. Correspondingly, while I am sympathetic to Sagoff’s critical arguments against the use of market to capture citizen judgements that appeal to moral and aesthetic values, I remain more sceptical of his endorsement of the Austrian case for markets and of his optimism for technological solutions within this market framework. Here I want to confine myself to two critical points, one theoretical about the epistemic limits to markets, the other more specific about physical and ecological limits to consumption.

Consider first Sagoff’s endorsement of the Austrian case for the market. Sagoff appeals to what I think is the strongest argument for the market from within the Austrian tradition — the epistemic argument of Hayek, which appeals to the division of knowledge in society. In developing this argument Hayek draws on a series of contrasts: the knowledge of scientific ‘experts’ is contrasted with the knowledge of ‘particular individuals’; scientific ‘knowledge of general rules’ is contrasted with knowledge of the ‘particular circumstances of time and place’ (Hayek, 1945, p. 521); ‘generic knowledge’ is contrasted with ‘knowledge of special circumstances’ (Hayek, 1960, p.371); propositional knowledge is contrasted with practical or ‘tacit’ knowledge embodied in practices and skills. Tacit local knowledge cannot be articulated in general propositional form that could be centralised for the purposes of social planning. The price mechanism in contrast is taken to communicate between individuals that information required for the co-ordination of their economic activities, while allowing them to employ their particular knowledge (Hayek, 1937, 1945). There is however a problem with this argument that Hayek himself acknowledges in a discussion of resource conservation.

In the course of a discussion of resource conservation Hayek makes the following concession about the place of scientific expertise in public life:

It cannot be denied that there are some facts concerning probable future developments which the government is more likely to know than most of the individual owners of natural resources. Many of the more recent achievements of science illustrate this. (Hayek, 1960, p. 371)

The problem that Hayek takes seriously here is that some knowledge that is relevant to the economy as a whole is scientific knowledge that is not dispersed across different market actors. Knowledge about future resources and the impacts of economic action fall within this category. Climate change offers an obvious contemporary example. Hayek in response argues that while such knowledge matters, so also does the local knowledge of actors which no central authority can possess. The solution he suggests lies in the dispersal of knowledge downwards so that individuals can use the generic knowledge founded upon scientific expertise in addition to their own special local knowledge. One can then leave the work of coordinating action to the market, which will allow each individual to make decisions on the basis of knowledge thus dispersed:

There will always exist, however, an even greater store of knowledge of special circumstances that ought to be taken into account in decisions about specific resources which only the individual owners will possess and which can never be concentrated within a single authority. Thus, if it is true that the government is likely to know some facts known to few others, it is equally true that the government will be necessarily ignorant of an even greater number of relevant facts known to some others. We can bring together all the knowledge that is relevant to particular problems only dispersing downward the generic knowledge available to government, not by centralizing the special knowledge possessed by individuals. (Hayek, 1960, p. 371)

There are problems with the dispersal of generic knowledge downwards as a solution to this problem from Hayek’s own assumptions. It assumes that the limits of the centralisation of all ‘special’ knowledge on a single actor or authority do not apply to the dispersal of all ‘generic’ scientific knowledge to each and every relevant individual actor. However, there is no good reason to assume that such dispersal is possible. First, as Hayek himself notes in accepting Michael Polanyi’s account of the tacit dimension of scientific knowledge, expert knowledge, no less than everyday knowledge, involves practical knowledge that cannot be all articulated in propositional form to be distributed downward to relevant actors. Second, even given the possibility of articulating all relevant knowledge in propositional form, to disperse such knowledge to all relevant individuals so that they could employ it in their individual acts of market exchange would be to place an informational burden on market actors that they could not be rationally expected to bear. While Hayek is properly aware of the epistemic limits of centralised planning, he fails to acknowledge the epistemic limits of markets. The attempt to resolve the problems of the division of scientific and expert knowledge in society by distributing it to individual market actors to use in their economic activities is on Hayek’s own assumptions open to the same objections as the centralisation of all knowledge to a single planning authority.

The point has more general implications for Sagoff’s arguments. When it comes to environmental goods, the Austrian case for market coordination is less robust than Sagoff assumes. Environmental policy needs to take seriously the role of impacts that cannot be captured in market terms. These include not just ethical and aesthetic values that are central to Sagoff’s arguments. They include also other physical and social impacts that cannot be caught in monetary measures but rather require non-monetary decision aids that employ directly in-kind information. The need for such in-kind information within public decision-making divides Neurath and the tradition of ecological economics from the Austrian tradition (O’Neill, 2004). It is here that Sagoff sides with the Austrian tradition in his scepticism of talk of physical limits. The flaws in the general argument have implications for his more specific discussions.

Consider in particular Sagoff’s arguments on consumption. The arguments about the limits in the growth of consumption turn in part on general scientific claims about the physical impact of such growth. As I noted above, scientific evidence about the impact of growing consumption on the emissions of greenhouse gases offers a good example of the kind of epistemic claim about the relative ignorance of individual actors that Hayek grants. Sagoff, like Hayek, responds by appealing to a combination of markets and technological development to resolve the problem. Consumption can and has become increasingly less resource and energy intense as technology develops (p. 118). Similarly technology will insure a shift to decreasing intensity in emissions for any unit of consumption. As fossil fuel prices rise, which they will if the distortion of subsidies to fossil fuels are removed, then the shift to cleaner energy can be assured.

There are at least two problems with Sagoff’s arguments. The first is, like many arguments that look simply to technological developments, the arguments confuse relative and absolute declines in material and energy intensity. It is true, as Sagoff claims, that the relative material, energy and emission intensity of consumption, the amount of material and energy required for and emissions generated by some unit of output consumption, has tended to fall with technological change. However, it does not follow that the total absolute material, energy and emission intensity of consumption in national or global economies will fall as a consequence. Given the total rates of growth in the global economy, falls in relative intensity can and have been paralleled by increases in the total absolute intensity. Thus, for example, while the relative global carbon intensity per dollar of consumption has declined by 0.7% per year since 1990, the total absolute carbon emissions have grown almost 2% per year during the same period, with a cumulative growth of 30% from 1990 to 2007 (Jackson, 2009, chapter 5). The second is about the disparity between the time and scale of the changes to which markets respond on the one hand the time and scale of the changes in climate on the other. Market prices respond to short term marginal changes. The effects of the cumulative growth of greenhouse gases are longer term and issue in non-marginal changes. There is little reason to believe that changes in market prices will track the kinds of changes in technology and consumption that are required to forestall serious climate change. In Hayekian terms, the kind of knowledge communicated by the price mechanism for the coordination of activities of actors in markets is not of the kind that is relevant for climate change policy. The knowledge embodied in science needs to guide economic activity. From Hayek’s own premises there is a good epistemic argument for planning and against markets when it comes to environmental policy.

Like the first edition of The Economy of the Earth, the second edition is an important contribution to the debates on the nature and scope of markets and politics in determining environmental policy. The new edition of Sagoff’s book restates the case against market-mimicking mechanisms in politics and defends a more deliberative account of public decision-making. However this is combined with an optimistic Austrian picture of the market economy itself. The combination of Austrian economics and deliberative politics carves out a peculiar and interesting form of environmental politics and economics which deserves wide attention. However, whether it is ultimately defensible is another matter. It is a position that is increasingly difficult to sustain in a world of climate change.


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Sagoff, M. 2008 The Economy of the Earth second edition Cambridge: Cambridge University Press