The Ecstatic Quotidian: Phenomenological Sightings in Modern Art and Literature

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Jennifer Anna Gosetti-Ferencei, The Ecstatic Quotidian: Phenomenological Sightings in Modern Art and Literature, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2007, 268pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780271032276.

Reviewed by K. Gover, Bennington College


The quotidian is an elusive and paradoxical phenomenon. Like the anthropologist whose very presence changes the society she intends to study, everydayness is transformed as soon as we try to reflect on it, since it is by definition that which recedes into the background. It seems that the only way to gain traction on the quotidian is through a kind of dialectic, whereby the familiar and the strange are held in contradistinction, each implying the other. Hence the paradoxical title of Gosetti-Ferencei's book The Ecstatic Quotidian, which means "stepping outside of an everyday familiarity": the ordinary can only be got hold of via the phenomenon of the extraordinary, and vice-versa.

The conceptual starting point of this book is the observation that modernist movements in philosophy and art all share a distinctive turn toward everydayness as a theme. Gosetti-Ferencei notes that the modernist interest in the quotidian is fundamentally ambivalent: it is an object of both fascination and denigration. In contrast to those theorists who are critical of the everyday, seeing it as fallen, alienated, and empty, Gosetti-Ferencei announces in the introduction that her book takes an affirmative approach. As its subtitle indicates, the book offers "sightings" of the ecstatic-everyday as it manifests itself in modernist art and thought. Each chapter approaches the subject either through a thematic lens, such as childhood, or through a particular medium, such as poetry or painting. As the term implies, these "sightings" are a series of scholarly, detailed discussions of the topic rather than an argument or series of arguments that build to a conclusion. The Ecstatic Quotidian is an excellent resource for those interested in the intersection between phenomenology and the visual art and poetry that both influenced and was inspired by it. Gosetti-Ferencei's insightful reflections and thorough research shows the richness of the dialogue between modernist art and thought. While the book leaves some of the larger implications of this dialogue unexplored, it is a valuable starting point for an investigation of the ways in which art and philosophy were engaged with each other in modernism to a degree perhaps unprecedented in the Western tradition.

While the subtitle of the book suggests that we will be presented with a series of readings of modernist artworks through the lens of phenomenology, what Gosetti-Ferencei really wants to do is to place the art on a more even footing with the philosophy. The book consists of a series of chapters which, generally speaking, begin with philosophy and (prose) literature in the first three chapters, then turn to poetry, and finally to painting. From these loosely related chapters (that have overlapping content) two general points emerge. First, phenomenology and existentialism on the one hand, and the painting and poetry that were contemporary with those philosophical movements on the other, both take up the dialectic of the familiar and the strange, the usual and un-usual as a key issue. Second, the philosophy and art that Gosetti-Ferencei discusses here are indebted to one another, or, as the author puts it, they are "interimplicated." In modernist philosophy’s and art's respective engagements with the dialectic of the everyday, they are also in dialogue with one another.

The first chapter is a rich discussion of the theme of everydayness in phenomenology and literature. Some figures, such as Sartre, serve double duty as both philosopher and novelist. Gosetti-Ferencei effectively shows the way in which the quotidian is a protagonist in both Nausea and Being and Nothingness. This chapter also shows that Heidegger, Sartre, et al. focus on everydayness, but for the most part this attention to the quotidian is lavished in order to denigrate it, to underscore its fallen, alienated character.

In the second chapter Gosetti-Ferencei turns to childhood experience as a source of a more "affirmative" approach to the everyday, in contrast to the denigration that she finds in existentialist thought and literature. Again she enlists phenomenology and literature to show that, despite their significant differences, Merleau-Ponty, Proust, Benjamin, Rilke, Frost, and Bachelard all turn to childhood consciousness as a model for the ecstatic quotidian. As the author acknowledges, one of the conceptual difficulties of "childhood consciousness" is that we only have access to such a concept once childhood is irrevocably behind us. Just as everydayness itself recedes from view once we turn our attention to it, the pre-reflective character of childhood experience is only available to us through a highly suspect reconstruction.

The third, fourth, and fifth chapters seem to me to be the heart of the book, in which Gosetti-Ferencei takes up the relation between phenomenology and literature, particularly poetry. The author, herself an accomplished poet, is on firm ground here both as a reader of poetry and as a scholar. (Her previous book was on Heidegger's reading -- and mis-reading -- of Hölderlin's poetry.) Gosetti-Ferencei shows Rilke to be the poet of phenomenology. In her discussion she builds upon Käte Hamburger's landmark work on that topic, but she also carries it further by suggesting that Rilke's poetry is not just a distillation of phenomenology, but also a challenge to its claims to universality. Chapter Five takes up the traditional opposition within aesthetics between poetry and painting as the media of time and space, respectively. Gosetti-Ferencei makes the persuasive case that phenomenology offers a genuine challenge to that division. Gosetti-Ferencei is at her best here when she brings together two traditionally opposed forms, be they literature and philosophy, or poetry and painting, and places them into productive dialogue with one another. What also emerges in these chapters is that the theme of the ecstatic quotidian to a great extent falls away and we see that what is really at stake here is the way in which language and seeing are connected.

This is underscored in the final two chapters, which are devoted to painting. One of the interesting and exciting aspects of Gosetti-Ferencei's treatment of painting is that she takes up two seemingly opposed poles, the avant-garde and kitsch. She moves from a discussion of the high modernist movement in painting championed by Clement Greenberg and ends with an oft-overlooked and maligned genre of painting, Trompe l'Oeil. Gosetti-Ferencei's attentive and intriguing discussion of Trompe l'Oeil painting was one of my favorite parts of the book. Unlike some of the book's other discussions of modernist poetry and painting in which the connection to the theme of the quotidian seemed labored, in this case Trompe l'Oeil is an obvious and at the same time unusual and refreshing choice. Gosetti-Ferencei effectively shows that this genre of painting is philosophically richer than one might think, and, like the paintings themselves, deserves a second look.

Having discussed the content, might I say a few words about the book's form? One does not expect as perfect an integration of form and content in academic writing as in the poetry and painting that Gosetti-Ferencei discusses. Her scholarly writing for the most part employs a refreshingly clear, straightforward style that only occasionally falls into labored academic prose. Nevertheless, I was surprised to find that the book was not edited for stylistic consistency and effectiveness. This is distracting to the reader and makes it more difficult for the author's message to be understood. There are three main areas in which I found the book to suffer from poor editing: annoying proofreading oversights, excessive use of the passive voice, and, worst of all, the wildly inconsistent and distracting treatment of text in translation. I will address only the last of these in more detail here.

I cannot recall reading a scholarly text with such a strange and distracting treatment of translations as this one. Because the book is mostly about German and French philosophers and poets, their texts are quoted or referred to on virtually every page. The book is written for an academic audience, and Gosetti-Ferencei seems to want to allow the reader to compare the translation to the original. This is certainly important, especially in the case of poetry. Nevertheless, it is cumbersome to have almost every title, phrase, and quote effectively doubled by presenting the original text and the translation together.

However, what is really frustrating here is that the book does not employ a consistent system for treating the texts in translation. At one point or another every possible way of presenting primary source material in a foreign language is used. For example, sometimes the German is given, followed by the English translation in brackets. Other times, this is reversed, and the translation is given first, with the original German in brackets following. Sometimes the text appears just in English, e.g., the quote from Wittgenstein on the first page of the first chapter. And occasionally just the German is given, as in the two lines of Rilke's poetry on page 130, without any corresponding translation into English, save for the gloss in the paragraph immediately following. References to the titles of foreign works suffer the same inconsistent treatment -- sometimes in only one language (variably English or the original), sometimes in both. Perhaps it may appear to be a niggling complaint, but even more distracting than the bilingual presentation of the texts was the striking inconsistency of the treatment. I would suggest that all titles, quotes, and poems in the main body of the text be translated and that the original German or French appear only in the endnotes, save for the occasional ambiguous or technical phrase, given in brackets within the English quote.

Those who study phenomenology are used to struggling with difficult prose. One of Gosetti-Ferencei's strengths as a writer is that, for the most part, she writes in a clear, straightforward style, even when the source material is obscure. Thus it is a shame that these oversights in editing undo some of her work.

In sum, The Ecstatic Quotidian is a scholarly, detailed overview of the places where modernist art and phenomenology intersect. It is an excellent resource for those who want to understand the ways in which modernist art and philosophy are indebted to one another. Although the larger implications of this mutual debt are left unexplored, it is a rich and suggestive discussion. We see clearly in this study the large extent to which literature and visual art engage some of the same questions that drove phenomenology and existentialism. As I mentioned at the beginning of this review, Gosetti-Ferencei's book begins with the observation that one of modernity's salient features is a turn to the quotidian as an object of investigation. Her study does not attempt to address the question of why it is that the everyday has a distinctive importance in modernism, or to show what is distinctive or different about modernism's approach to it. Nor does the book have much to say about what these phenomenological "sightings" in art and literature imply about the larger question of the relation between art and philosophy. Is the "ancient quarrel" finally over? These larger questions are engendered by the book's analyses but are beyond its scope. The scholarly work done in this book could profitably be used to develope an argument about these questions. The thinkers and artists whom Gosetti-Ferencei discusses are interested in overturning our assumptions about everyday experience. By engaging philosophy, literature, and visual art into such a productive dialogue with one another, the author succeeds in placing some of our basic assumptions about these forms and their differences into question as well.