The Edinburgh Critical History of Nineteenth-Century Philosophy

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Alison Stone (ed.), The Edinburgh Critical History of Nineteenth-Century Philosophy, Edinburgh University Press, 2011, 344pp., $240.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748635665.

Reviewed by Colin McQuillan, University of Tennessee Knoxville


The idea of "critical" history emerged during the nineteenth century, when historians adopted critical methods from philology. By applying critical methods to history, historians hoped to produce a history that was like the critical edition of a text. Critical history would present an authentic account of the period it addressed, note important sources and variations, and provide an apparatus that provides context and perspective.

In the General Editors' Preface to the Edinburgh Critical History of Philosophy series, Howard Caygill and David Webb present a different view of critical history, which is related to Kant's critical philosophy (vii). Caygill and Webb argue that while critical philosophy reflects on the limits of what can be thought, the history of philosophy reminds us that different things have been and can be thought at different times. This makes a critical history of philosophy "an indispensable resource, a testing ground, and a reminder that we are never really done with thinking" (vii).

Alison Stone's introduction reveals that the Edinburgh Critical History of Nineteenth-Century Philosophy is more narrowly focused. According to Stone,

nineteenth-century philosophy can be broadly characterized by several themes: the conflict between metaphysics and religious faith on the one hand and the empirical sciences on the other; a new focus on history, progress, and evolution; new ideas of individuality, society, and revolution; and ever-increasing concerns about nihilism(1).

These are the themes which "become important in relation to later Continental European philosophy" and they represent the "particular but not exclusive focus" of the volume (5).

The first three chapters deal with German philosophy in the first half of the nineteenth century. In Chapter 1, "The New Spinozism," George di Giovanni describes the effect of the pantheism dispute in German philosophy at the end of the eighteenth century. Interestingly, di Giovanni suggests that Goethe, and not Lessing or Mendelssohn, was the real object of Jacobi's attack on Spinozism. He also describes how Kantians like Reinhold reacted to Jacobi's attack and how Jacobi responded to the idealism of Fichte and the early Schelling, painting a compelling picture of the debates that animated German philosophy at the turn of the nineteenth century. Dalia Nassar addresses these debates again in Chapter 2, "The Absolute in German Romanticism and Idealism." Nassar notes how Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel challenged the dualisms of Kant's critical philosophy, and then turns to Hegel and the epistemological problems involved in knowing the absolute. Chapter 3, "The Question of Romanticism," proposes a new approach to the study of romanticism. Judith Norman and Alistair Welchman examine "romantic subjects and romanticism as a self-constituting category, rather than an externally imposed one" (48). While they manage to discuss an impressive number of figures and themes associated with romanticism, especially German romanticism, Norman and Welchman's article does not really succeed in developing the new approach they propose. For this reason, it is like many of the fragmentary, romantic works Norman and Welchman discuss.

Chapters 4, 5, and 6 concern the relationship between philosophy and empirical science during the nineteenth century. In Chapter 4, "The Hermeneutic Turn in Philosophy of Nature in the Nineteenth Century," Philippe Huneman tells a fascinating story about the rise and fall of idealistic Naturphilosophie, describing it as a hermeneutic enterprise attempting to decipher the meaning of nature. Sebastian Gardner addresses similar issues in Chapter 5, "Idealism and Naturalism in the Nineteenth Century," although he places more emphasis on the ways in which natural scientific knowledge and metaphysical speculation were related to one another. Chapter 6, "Darwinism and Philosophy in the Nineteenth Century" complements both of the previous chapters by showing how Darwinism affected philosophy. Gregory Moore describes in detail the often bizarre ways in which Darwinism was used in metaphysics, philosophy of mind, and ethics, proving that Darwinism did not displace philosophy but, in many instances, provided an occasion for philosophical speculation.

Chapters 7, 8, and 11 could be read as a survey of the relationship between philosophy and the human sciences in the nineteenth century, complementing the discussion of philosophy and natural science in earlier chapters. In Chapter 7, "Faith and Knowledge," George Pattison discusses the relationship between theology and philosophy after Hegel, particularly in Erdmann, Strauss, Feuerbach, and Kierkegaard. He emphasizes the ways in which philosophy was used to found speculative theologies, which were then subjected to historical, anthropological, and specifically religious criticism. In Chapter 8, "Philosophising History: Distinguishing History as a Discipline," James Connelly attribute the rise of historicism in the nineteenth century to Hegel's philosophy of history. He also provides an extended and very interesting discussion of the British idealists' views on history. Günter Gödde presents a very interesting discussion of developments in psychology in the nineteenth century in Chapter 11, "The Unconscious in the German Philosophy and Psychology of the Nineteenth Century." Gödde highlights the influence of Leibniz's pétites perceptions on the cognitive conception of the unconscious in Herbart and Fechner, the role an unconscious "vital power" played in Hamann, Herder, and the young Goethe, as well as the concept of an unconscious will in Schelling, Schopenhauer, Hartmann, and Nietzsche, before considering the psychoanalytic conception of the unconscious in Freud.

Chapters 12, 13, and 14 are devoted to social and political philosophy. Alex Zakaras addresses the concepts of individuality and individualism in Chapter 12, "Individuality, Radical Politics, and the Metaphor of the Machine." He describes the promise individuality held for figures like Schleiermacher, Humboldt, Leroux, and Mill. These figures were, as a result of the value they attributed to individuality, opposed to the concept of the machine, whose parts have no distinctive character. Zakaras also recounts the worries about individualism that became more and more pronounced during the nineteenth century. In Chapter 13, "The Rise of the Social," William Outhwaite describes the way in which concerns about individuality and equality gave rise to new conceptions of society. These, in turn, gave rise to new conceptions of history and politics. The revolutions of the nineteenth century and their relation to philosophy are discussed in Chapter 14, "Theory and Practice of Revolution in the Nineteenth Century." In this chapter, Paul Blackledge outlines the development that leads from the French Revolution to Marxism, Anarchism, and Social Democracy.

It is difficult to classify Chapters 9, 10, 15, and 16. Chapter 9, "Genealogy as Immanent Critique: Working from the Inside," Robert Guay moves quickly from Rousseau, Kant, Hegel, Marx, and Mill to Nietzsche, Adorno, and Foucault. He argues that genealogy is essentially cosmopolitan and critical, concerns historical agency, and approaches its objects through a historical-hermeneutic method. Unfortunately, it is difficult to find the thread tying all these elements together. Chapter 10, "Embodiment: Conceptions of the Lived Body from Maine de Biran to Bergson" by Mark Sinclair, is also difficult to situate, but it is a very interesting study of nineteenth-century attempts to solve the mind-body problem. Sinclair's contribution is also one of the few chapters that focuses on French philosophy. Michael Gillespie discusses the problem of nihilism in Chapter 15, "Nihilism in the Nineteenth Century: From Absolute Subjectivity to Superhumanity." Gillespie provides a reliable historical overview of the different senses in which the term was used during the nineteenth century and the different parties which were blamed for its emergence. In Chapter 16, "Repetition and Recurrence: Putting Metaphysics in Motion," Clare Carlisle compares repetition in Kierkegaard with the eternal recurrence of the same in Nietzsche. According to Carlisle, the movement of repetition and recurrence in Kierkegaard and Nietzsche unite being and becoming, which Carlisle, following Deleuze, associates with the "what" and "how" of philosophy.

Chapter 17, Andrew Bowie's "Nineteenth-Century Philosophy in the Twentieth Century and Beyond," is a fitting conclusion for the book. Bowie discusses the role that nineteenth century philosophy played in Anglo-American analytic philosophy and continental European philosophy in the twentieth century. Bowie pays special attention to the methodological issues involved in using the history of philosophy as a guide to philosophical reflection in addition to considering the critique of metaphysics that develops out of nineteenth-century philosophy in both the analytic and continental traditions. The linguistic and hermeneutic turns in analytic and continental philosophy and their relation to nineteenth-century philosophy are also discussed.

Caygill and Webb's plans for the Edinburgh Critical History of Philosophy are commendable, as is Stone's approach to the volume on nineteenth-century philosophy. Many of the articles in The Edinburgh Critical History of Nineteenth-Century Philosophy are quite good, especially those by di Giovanni, Nassar, Huneman, Gardner, Moore, Gödde, Zakaras, Sinclair, and Bowie. These articles display the kind of critical knowledge which is, to be sure, found in many different parts of philosophy. Yet the knowledge that exists in these studies rarely makes the transition to the general history of philosophy, which is still encumbered by outdated narratives, the interests of later periods, and the ideologies of various schools of philosophy. That is why there is still such a great need for critical histories of philosophy.