The Ego and the Flesh: An Introduction to Egoanalysis

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Jacob Rogozinski, The Ego and the Flesh: An Introduction to Egoanalysis, Robert Vallier (tr.), Stanford University Press, 2010, 352pp, $ 27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804759892.

Reviewed by Ari Hirvonen, University of Helsinki, Finland


Who am I?

The ego strikes back; this is the message of Jacob Rogozinski's captivating and thought-provoking book, The Ego and the Flesh.

"What remains to be thought today is me [moi]", says an unnamed ego in a fictive dialogue between two friends at the beginning of the book. She/he is not interested in considering the idea of the subject or the ego (le moi) as a universal ego or as an empty form, but thinking about the ego that is entirely given by the experience I have of it at every moment. It is me as a living and singular ego, a me who is engaged in a singular relation not only to its body, desire, anxiety, pain and joy but also to the world and others.

Who am I? -- this is an unanswerable question that comes over me again and again. This is the question that Rogozinski's book not only asks but also answers. Instead of devoting itself to a narcissistic introspection or an ontological egocentrism, Rogozinski's radical thinking of the ego is a quest for the true ego, that is, a singular ego that precedes all its alienating identifications with the figures of the Other. The ego Rogozinski presents in the book is irreducible and cannot be derived from any non-ego.

What is more, resistance to suppression presupposes a singular ego: "as soon as one renounces the ego's freedom, as soon as one denies it the power to be called by itself, the temptation to bow before the figure of Fate, God, Hero, Führer, or Being is great" (38).

The claim of Rogozinski's book is that philosophy must return to the singularity of the ego that sufficiently affirms itself. The categorical imperative of the book is that "one must never give up on the egological difference" (35). We must respect our unique ego, we should not forget its singularity and we should not let it be substituted for and identified with some transcendent Other -- Being, Structure, Life, the symbolic Other.

Failures of egocide

Rogozinski starts his return to the truth of the ego by demarcating his egoanalysis from those of philosophers and psychoanalysts who have committed egocide, the denouncement, destitution and destruction of the ego. None of them has been able to show how the ego would be constituted on the basis of a more originary agency than the ego, i.e., on the basis of the non-ego.

Heidegger, "the most powerful and radical egocide" (14), and Lacan are Rogozinski's most important sparring partners, whose failures he is committed to reveal. They submit the singular ego entirely to Being and the Other, but they are not really able to get rid of the ego's persistence in Dasein and Subject.

Heidegger's error is not the solipsism of his approach but its not being solipsistic enough. For him, Dasein, which Rogozinski translates as l'existant, "existing-being", is both the singular existing being, which is always mine, and a universal, neutral and anonymous Self with which Heidegger finally identifies Dasein. This leads Heidegger to betray his own initial thesis and as a result Dasein loses its ownmost singularity. The being-one's-self (Selbstsein) of Dasein is now presented as an anonymous, universal neutral Self (Selbst), which was supposed to define authentic existence, but which resembles the They (das Man). Since Heidegger concentrates on the ontological difference between Being and beings, he dismisses "the ecological difference" between me and everything that is not me, which would help him to dissociate myself from the everyday inauthentic existence.

Death does not save Heidegger. Being-toward-death is not able to summon Dasein and free it from its alienation in the They, since it becomes common and impersonal being-able-to-die. Moreover, Rogozinski continues, Heidegger interprets being-toward-death in terms of self-sacrifice, which requires dying for something other than the self. Being-toward-death turns into a sacrificial dying-for-another, into a communitarian heroic sacrifice. Moreover, he did not see that a self-sacrificing person, for whom the ego and its life is nothing, is also able to murder others. Rogozinski even describes the Heideggerian politics of 1933 as "a politics of being-toward-death", even though "this does not necessarily mean that it justifies murder" (34).

For Rogozinski, there is a fatal failure in Heidegger's ontology as it fails to adhere to Dasein's self-givenness. The main reason for this is that it is based on "the egocidal thesis", which revokes the ego in the name of Dasein, and on "the thanatological thesis", which turns away from life in the name of being-toward-death. The conjunction of egocide and thanatology leads Heidegger to reject immanency and subject Dasein to the transcendent, to the figure of the One, to the domination of the community, to the total State -- it even allowed Heidegger to place his philosophy in the service of Hitler.

Even though Rogozinski admits that he long admired Lacan's theory for its rigor and radicality, he denounces Lacan for reducing "all living subjectivity to bloodless X, a fading spectre" (69).

Lacan's failure takes place both at the level of the Imaginary and the Symbolic. Lacan did not admit that the ego is the precondition for imaginary identification with the captivating specular image. According to Rogozinski, if I misrecognize myself in this image, there must already be I. Lacan did not recognize that an originary self-identification precedes imaginary identifications.

Through a "baroque wedding of Freud and Saussure" (64), Lacan then tries to find a way out of the impasse of the imaginary identification by demarcating the imaginary ego and the symbolic subject. Still, according to Rogozinski, this does not solve Lacan's failure, since he merely repeats on the symbolic level the ego's subjection to its reflection and thus submits the subject to the Other. The only way the subject of unconscious desire and language would be able to dissociate itself from the Other, Rogozinski argues, is that there would be an originary nucleus of the subject. Nevertheless, Lacan fails to recognize this. As a result, in his psychoanalysis, there is no possibility for I as the subject of my desire to arise in the place where there had been only the subject of alienation (Wo Es war, soll Ich werden).

Descartes' ego

If we want to be faithful to the aforementioned Freudian imperative, we must take a step beyond Freud, or rather a step backward from him and return to Descartes, who makes a radical critique of the ego's alienation possible. For Rogozinski, more important than cogito ergo sum is ego sum, ego existo, "I am, I exist". This bare affirmation of ego's existence is the starting point for Rogozinski's own egoanalysis.

According to Rogozinski, even if the Cartesian ego is a pure and anonymous ego and not the mundane and narcissistic one (ego-in-the-world), it is not an abstract concept, since it attests to a singular existence and its incarnation in its flesh. What resists, what is cogito, Rogozinski argues, is not "I reason" but "I sense" and this sensing is always true. Hence, I am the truth, I give a birth to myself and I exist only when myself is revealed to me. These revelations are singular events that exist because there is an archi-event I am.

However, because I, as being-in-birth, have to reaffirm myself every moment, Descartes has to look for a more stable foundation for the ego. He doesn't have the guts to sustain the privilege of the ego right up to the end. In Descartes' theological turn, God becomes the name of the omnipotent and good Other. For Rogozinski, this is the disaster and negation of the first and second Mediation. Descartes' failure consists of his turning from the path of resistance to the path of submission to the transcendent God. Therefore, Descartes is actually the first egocidal thinker, even if "we owe him everything" (119).

Because of this, Rogozinski will be more Cartesian than Descartes as he demands that we resist all attempts to submit the ego to the transcendent God/Other. This "ethics of resistance" (86) is the affirmation of the egological difference.


Rogozinski's book is an introduction to his egoanalysis, which would reveal me to myself in truth, in the place of truth that is immanence -- residing on the inside -- that designates the place of the ego. Egoanalysis must thus brush transcendence aside without denying it.

Therefore, Rogozinski turns toward Descartes' only heir, Husserl and his method of phenomenological reduction. The starting point for Rogozinski is the immanent ego, which is its flesh (Husserl's Leib, la chair), an originally incarnated ego, Ichleib, an ego-flesh, that temporalizes itself and is one with the immanent temporality or the living present. Rogozinski also takes a step beyond Husserl, who, like Descartes, agrees with the ego-killers on one thing: the ego is originally one. For Rogozinski, the ego is the unity of the multiple, that is, the ego is originally divided yet unified. The ego gives itself from the multiple fragments of itself to itself and thus constitutes itself as a unitary ego.

The main question for Rogozinski's egoanalysis is the chiasm, but not as it was presented by Husserl, for whom it was obvious that the same hand can be both touching and touched and that the two hands belong to the same body. Rogozinski's more radical epokhè, which considers the carnal chiasm as the foundational event, offers a way out from this naïve certainty. For Rogozinski, the tactile chiasm is central but not all there is: it sustains the visual quasi-chiasm between my look and the image of my body and the vocal-auditory quasi-chiasm between my speech and my hearing.

The tactile-carnal chiasm is at the origin of the ego. It is "an act of birth" (152). In its event "my dispersed flesh unifies itself and makes itself into a body in the world" (171). To present the way in which the miracle of chiasm takes place, Rogozinski starts from the primordial flesh that is merely carnal poles. The ego is dispersed into innumerable ego-splinters or polar larval egos. The various poles are unified, tied together within the chiasm, where they encounter one another and identify with each other. In this chiasm, the ego-flesh gives itself to itself. Only after this, the ego-flesh gives itself a body and the poles of flesh appear as members of the body. In this way, my true ego is generated in the chiasm that both gives time (an immanent temporality where the present is not a point in time but a layer in movement) -- as it assures the unification of the temporal fluxes of the poles of flesh and the egos present in each pole -- and space -- as it constitutes the flesh as flesh (incarnation and incorporation) and the body (incorporation as subjectification).

Does Rogozinski here propose some kind of self-presence of the absolute coherency and unity of the ego? No, since the fusion of the two poles of the chiasm is not complete and when the ego-flesh emerges from the chiasm, it discovers that it is divided. Otherwise, the carnal poles would be absolutely fused together so that it would be impossible for the ego-flesh to give itself a body with different organs. Something in the poles resists identification. The identification produced in the chiasm produces the leftover of non-flesh, the remainder, which is not the effect of a temporal divergence, as Merleau-Ponty argued.

As I touch myself, there are two different perceptions that are situated in two different poles. The initial perceptions are divided into the sensation of a transcendent object of the touched hand and the immanent sensing of the touching hand. Moreover, the immanent sensing is divided into the primary content of perception that points at an exterior thing and impressions where my flesh is affected by itself. The touching hand does not rejoin absolutely the touched hand and the remainder is what separates the experience of touching from itself. As a result, the ego-flesh is divided into the consciousness of being mine and the consciousness of being foreign. What is extremely important to Rogozinski is that the invisible, unsayable, unhearable remainder, which is born of a tactile synthesis, does not come from outside but is of my flesh; it is given in my flesh as foreign to my flesh: it is "transcendence in immanence".

Only now does Rogozinski present the other, whom I do not confront merely as a thing or as meat, but whom I recognize as flesh similar to my own flesh, as my alter ego. The constitution of the other repeats the originary synthesis in the chiasm. I project my own flesh and my first foreigner, the reminder, onto the other's body. At the origin of every community is the "archi-community of my poles of flesh" (216), which consists in my ego-flesh that was identified with itself in the chiasm.

One of the most interesting "concepts" in Rogozinski's radical epokhè is the remainder, based on which he presents in a fascinating way the castration complex, repulsion, abjection, the stigmatisation and persecution of those who are seen in as representatives of the remainder, of hatred -- the major figure of radical evil -- that turns abjection into rejection and aims at destroying and annihilating the remainder, death as an event immanent to life, love and respect.

Rogozinski shows how egoanalysis opens the possibilities of breaking from the logic of disgust and hatred. What is needed is the truth of the remainder, that is, the truth of the ego.

Phenomenology meets psychoanalysis

After Rogozinski's book, Descartes and Husserl are not exactly the same as they had been. His fascinating interpretation of these two thinkers of the ego opens new ways of thinking not only these two egos but also the truth of the ego. In a captivating way, Rogozinski manages to base his egoanalysis on Descartes' doubt and Husserl's epokhè and, at the very same moment, radicalize their "methods" and proceed beyond them. This is deconstruction at its best.

As has become clear, Rogozinski's book sets Descartes and Husserl against Spinoza, Hume, Kant, Heidegger, Freud, Lacan, Sartre, Merleau-Ponty, Levinas and Deleuze. He has a critical but also intimate discussion with them as he thinks with and against them, as he starts from their concepts and reveals the limits and impasses of these concepts, as he affirms their visions and defers them through his radical epokhè. Merleau-Ponty especially seems to accompany Rogozinski in the forest of the ego where paths of phenomenological reduction and psychoanalysis are intertwined.

I was wondering whether Derrida should be added to this list. Even if the first thing that comes to mind in relation to Derrida is not the affirmation of the ego, Rogozinski does not condemn him as an egocidal thinker. As "one of the greatest contemporary philosophers" (166), he carries off the deconstruction of Husserlian haptocentrism, the metaphysics of touch bringing forth the fact that the chiasm as the immediate coincidence of two hands, the experience of the touching-touched, is always traversed by an inner and irreducible alterity. Moreover, Derrida deconstructs the opposition between touching as a sense of proximity and the exteriority of vision. However, Rogozinski professes, the chiasm happens for Derrida only by failing to happen. This Rogozinski sees as a more general problem since for Derrida every event happens only by not happening. For Derrida, the balance always tips to the side of the impossible and the heteron takes precedence over the auton. This discussion with Derrida is alluring and fruitful. What is more, the absence of one name makes its presence felt. Rogozinski refers to Derrida's book on Nancy, but he never mentions Nancy, whose writing, especially about the corpus, intimately touches the very same issues as Rogozinski's egoanalysis.

For me, the most problematic part of Rogozinski's book is his criticism of Heidegger and Lacan. Even if one could accept Rogozinski's aim to cease to determine the ego on the basis of Being and of transcendence, to free the ego from "the cross of Being" -- the branches consist of ontological neutrality, being-in-the-world, being-with-others and being-toward-death -- to which it is nailed, one could still ask whether Rogozinski's reading of Heidegger does justice to these branches. Is it really true that Heideggerian Dasein, whose existence is grounded on its relation to Being, identifies itself with the world and others, exists only in the other, is condemned to "an alienation without return" (42)? I doubt it. I would not consider the transcendence of being-toward or being-over-there as an alienating phenomenon. Moreover, at the same time as transcendence is firmly and with necessity connected to alienation, Rogozinski scales back its importance as he translates Dasein as l'existant, existing being. Even if there is a trace of transcendence in the prefix ex-, it does not catch the meaning of Dasein, the relationship between over-there and being.

It is true that Lacan says that the total form of the child's body is given to him as a Gestalt, in an exteriority in which it appears to him as the contour of his stature that freezes it. However, Lacan also says that the recognition of his own image as such in a mirror

immediately gives rise in a child to the series of gestures where he playfully experiences the relationship between the movements made in the image and the reflected environment, and between this virtual complex and the reality it duplicates -- namely the child's own body, and the persons and the reality it duplicates".[1]

Moreover, Rogozinski writes that "imaginary space is the space of the ego and its rivalry with the 'object-a' [l'objet petit-a], which is its specular double" (64), but this object-a is not so much a specular double or others as the objects of desire but the object cause of desire (as Rogozinski himself says when he speaks about it as the "non-imagined residue of the body", 263), which is related to instincts, to the remains of the Real, to the dimensions of the body that is beyond the organic body, to the gaze, voice and phallus. Unfortunately, Rogozinski does not elaborate the connection between the remainder and the object-a, both of which touch the flesh. He also more or less ignores Lacan's Real, which is inextricably linked with the Imaginary and the Symbolic. I would have hoped for a more thorough dialogue with Lacan (what is the status of flesh in Lacan's psychoanalysis?), especially since Rogozinski says that his egoanalysis does not replace psychoanalysis but enters "into dialogue with it in order to allow it to reground itself, to recenter itself on the truth of the ego" (75). Then again, Rogozinski's book manages to bring phenomenology and psychoanalysis together in a fascinating and original way. His idea about the law of remainder, which prohibits me from fusing with the (M)Other, that precedes any intervention of the law of the father is of the utmost importance.

Rogozinski's egoanalysis itself is an extremely refreshing project of radical epokhè that questions the self-evident truths of the deconstruction of the subject, which has lost its (or at least some of its) radicality as it has become a compulsory discipline in academia. In an original way, sometimes even daringly, Rogozinski's egoanalysis both seeks and grounds the truth of the singular ego by bringing the flesh and body together. He makes masterful use of his version of epohkè (suspension of transcendence and the certainty of being in the world with others, and being embodied and existing) and invites us to follow his egoanalysis in our singular way. For those who are afraid that the radical thinking of the ego would ground a unified and solipsistic fortress-ego, the One against the Other, I guarantee that nothing like that takes place. Instead, Rogozinski's chiasmatic ego is always the ego of multiplicities, and his ego-flesh is always already divided and dispersed into innumerable poles which the syntheses of incorporations unite.

The book truly manages not merely to ask the question "Who am I?" but also brilliantly answers it. Its most important politico-philosophico-psychoanalytic message is that the ego that opts for truth is the ego that does not give up its freedom, that is able to free itself of hatred, which Rogozinski says is "an unconditional obligation" (258). All in all, the book is an impressive journey into the truth of the ego, that is, into my flesh and body.

Robert Vallier's translation is superb. There are many complicated and ambiguous French phrases and words, whose nuances Vallier has managed to preserve in a convincing way. One reads (aloud) his translation with pleasure.

[1] Jacques Lacan, Écrits, translated by Bruce Fink, Norton, 2006, p. 75.