The Elusive God: Reorienting Religious Epistemology

Placeholder book cover

Paul K. Moser, The Elusive God: Reorienting Religious Epistemology, Cambridge UP, 2008, 292pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780521120081.

Reviewed by Bruce Russell, Wayne State University



Many of our beliefs are justified on the basis of experiences, where experiences are non-propositional mental states, unlike beliefs, wishes, hopes, etc., that have propositions as their objects. I smell coffee or apple pie and on that basis justifiably believe that there is coffee, or a freshly baked apple pie, in the kitchen. I hear a police siren and on that basis justifiably believe that a police car is passing by on the street outside. I go to a children’s museum, stick my hand in a box that contains various items, feel a hair brush and a piece of sandpaper, and on the basis of the tactile sensations I receive justifiably believe that these items are in the box. My children blindfold me and play “Name That Taste” with me. They give me a spoonful of honey and squeeze a lemon into a glass and have me drink the juice. On the basis of taste, I justifiably believe that I have tasted honey and lemon juice. I am walking along the beach and see footprints of bare feet in the wet sand at the edge of the water. On the basis of my visual sensations, I justifiably believe that someone recently walked there. Olfactory, auditory, tactile, taste, and visual sensations are not propositional (they do not have propositions as their objects), but they can provide evidence for beliefs, which are propositional.

At least some of the time, we are justified in believing what we do (e.g., that there is coffee in the kitchen, a police car out on the street, sandpaper in the box, honey on the spoon, and that someone recently walked along the beach) because the proposition that we believe is the best available undefeated explanation of what we experience. While someone could have sprayed coffee smelling air freshener in the kitchen, or bought rubber feet at a novelty store, attached them to long poles, rented a helicopter and made fake footprints in the sand, the best explanation of the relevant sensations is that there is coffee in the kitchen and that someone recently walked on the beach, respectively. Because of that, we are justified in believing there is coffee in the kitchen and that someone recently walked along the beach.

Paul Moser thinks that certain sorts of experience provide conclusive evidence for the existence of God, but they are not “the mystical, spectacular, or fantastic religious experiences reported by many proponents of religious belief” (p. 8; see also 132 and 138). And he places little stock in the arguments from natural theology, describing them as “at best incidental, even a dispensable sideshow” (p. 25; see also 45, 47, 52, 136-37, 155, 244). Moser thinks that experiential evidence of God’s existence comes through personal interaction with God’s Spirit and is available to everyone who is willing to receive it. It constitutes conclusive evidence for belief in God, that is, it not only justifies the belief that God exists but also warrants trust in God. By “conclusive evidence” he means “well-founded undefeated support suitable for (fulfilling the justification condition for) knowledge: it may or may not be logically, or deductively, demonstrative” (p. 2). By “God” Moser means “a being inherently worthy of worship who is morally perfect, morally authoritative, and perfectly loving to all persons, including enemies” (see pp. 1, 19, 86).

For Moser, the evidence that supports belief in God is non-propositional and comes through Spirit revealing itself in human conscience (p. 193). Again and again, he refers to such evidence as “purposively available authoritative evidence” of God’s existence and His willingness to help people become unselfishly loving (see all the entries in the Index on “purposively available evidence”). According to Moser, the experience of Spirit in conscience provides the “needed epistemological foundation” for experiential knowledge of God similar to the way that non-propositional olfactory, auditory, tactile, visual, and taste sensations provide the epistemological foundations for knowledge of things and events in the world. (Moser uses the example of someone whose red sensations provide evidence for her belief that there is a red patch in her visual field, p. 63). He writes,

First-hand volitional evidence and knowledge of God’s reality involve a directness in evidence and knowledge of divine reality that entails their being irreducible to mere propositional knowledge or evidence that God exists. The directness involves evidence of an “I-You” volitional interaction between humans and God that is absent from traditional arguments for God’s existence… . My talk of (first-hand) evidence and knowledge of “God’s reality” (or of “God”) should be understood accordingly, as irreducible to mere propositional evidence or knowledge. (p. 61)

He goes on to compare the available evidence of God in conscience to the evidence from conscience that supports our beliefs about what we have a duty to do, or refrain from doing (p. 62). Conscience convicts us of being too selfish, of failing to be unselfishly loving, and if we do not suppress the voice of conscience, “we then experience guilt, shame, and judgment” (p. 43). Moser does not think that the first-hand, foundational experiences of God in conscience are self-authenticating (p. 27). As such, they are not like our experiences of pain or, if Sartre is right, the awareness of another consciousness that results from realizing one is being looked at, perhaps in a compromising position. But Moser thinks that the reason we should believe that the experiences of Spirit in conscience are genuine experiences of God is that the assumption that they are is the best undefeated available explanation of those experiences and other evidence we possess (see pp. 27, 64-5, 69, 85, 139, 150).

Part of this other evidence is to be found in the volitional transformation, the change in our wills and attitudes, that follows upon the apparent experience of Spirit in conscience (see p. 150 and the end of Chapter 2). Moser writes, “As human history and our own lives show, if they show anything, we lack the power on our own to love unselfishly as God loves” (p. 152; see also pp. 17, 137). However, people find that after their experience of Spirit in conscience they are empowered to love more unselfishly. Moser thinks that the best explanation of the change is that God, through his grace, has helped transform these people (p. 156; on p. 22 he writes of “a change in life-direction” as being “salient evidence of divine intervention” and on pp. 155-57 he argues that beneficial changes in a person’s life that follow the relevant experiences in conscience are best explained by God’s empowering the person to make those changes, that the changes for the better are “salient evidence” of God’s intervening).

Moser never says precisely what the experiences of Spirit in conscience are like. Do the people who have them hear an inner voice that tells them how destructively selfish and prideful they are? Or are they like the experiences of Alvin Plantinga who reports that sometimes he just immediately forms the belief that God disapproves of what he has done? Or do they just feel the presence of God in some way, as people sometimes report feeling the presence of their deceased loved ones?

In any case, it does not seem that the best explanation of the experiences of Spirit in conscience is that it is God’s self-revelation to those people. Conscience itself probably has an evolutionary explanation. Our human ancestors who had a conscience probably did better in situations involving social cooperation than those that did not. Perhaps those who felt the presence, or heard the voice, of some all-powerful Father did even better, for they were very reluctant to break promises or to free ride on the backs of others. Those with moral sentiments backed up by a powerful enforcer may have done better than those with no moral sentiments, or with moral sentiments that were not backed up by a powerful enforcer. As a result of doing better, they left more offspring that survived.

Further, it’s not clear that the best explanation of the transformation in people after they’ve seemed to have had an experience of Spirit in conscience is that the transformation was caused by God. Suppose someone appears to me in my dreams who looks like my deceased grandmother and seems to be unselfishly loving and forgiving. Suppose she appears again and again, night after night, year after year. Suppose, further, that as a result of these dream experiences my life changes for the better, and I come to believe that my grandmother still exists in some way. Imagine that as a result of the experiences of my grandmother in my dreams I become a better person, more loving and forgiving, even of my enemies. Wouldn’t the best explanation of those experiences be that they were somehow produced by me alone, say, by the neurons in my brain firing in certain ways, and wouldn’t the best explanation of the change in my life be that my belief that my good and loving grandmother still exists and wants me to become more unselfishly loving somehow caused those changes? There is no need to posit the existence of my grandmother to explain either my experiences of her or the changes in my life.

Something similar seems to be true when it is a question of what the best explanation of experiences of God in conscience is and of the transformation that occurs in the lives of certain people who have had those experiences. Granted that we learn over time that in some sense we cannot become more unselfishly loving through our own efforts. Still, we might reply that all that shows is that we cannot become more unselfishly loving through our own efforts if we do not believe that there is some Higher Power who will help us change. But that does not mean that the best explanation of such a change implies that there is such a Higher Power; it only means that such an explanation will involve the belief that there is such a Power. Parsimony would seem to require positing the belief as the cause, not the Higher Power which is the object of that belief. There can be a placebo effect in religion as well as in research.

Of course, this line of objection to Moser’s argument grants that people learn over time that they cannot become more loving through their own efforts. But surely, over time, some atheists have become as unselfishly loving as any Christians, even if not through their own efforts alone but with the assistance of their loved ones, friends, and therapists. Of course, it may be that people generally are unable to become more unselfishly loving through their own power (see p. 137). Maybe they need the help of others, either other human beings or belief in the existence of a Higher Power. But none of these things implies that the best explanation of changes for the better in people’s lives who have had God experiences is that God exists.

Moser claims that the existence of God is the best undefeated available explanation of certain experiences in conscience and of the transformation that sometimes follows. I have argued that it is not the best available explanation of those things. But even if it is, isn’t it defeated by the existence of evil, particularly by the fact that we die and the fact that God remains hidden to many human beings who, according to Moser, need His help to overcome their destructive selfishness and death itself? Not according to Moser. If we understand that God’s purpose is for people to enter freely into fellowship with him as unselfishly loving persons, then we can understand why there is death and why God sometimes remains hidden to some. Moser writes, “Death announces, if we listen carefully, that we need outside help, beyond our own human powers, for lasting satisfaction, meaning, and life” and “we may regard death as a curse brought or allowed by God in order to manifest the human need of God’s power in the face of human selfishness and inadequacy toward life” (pp. 257, 247). He also refers to death as a divine wake-up call that serves to alert people to the fact that if they do not change their destructive selfish ways they will end up with nothing (cf., p. 257).

So much for death. But why would God remain elusive and hidden? Wouldn’t he want his beloved children to know him so that they could join in fellowship with him? According to Moser, God must be careful in how he reveals himself. He wants people to worship him freely, but if the evidence he presents is overwhelming, like evidence of a throbbing toothache or splitting headache, then belief in God would be coerced (see p. 242). Non-coercive evidence from God “may intrude a bit into our experience, say in conscience, but it can readily be overlooked, ignored, suppressed, or dismissed by us, because it’s intended by God not to coerce a will toward or against God but to be willingly received by humans” (p. 243). Further, God must be careful that prideful humans do not rebel against, and come to hate, Him because they do not want to relinquish their autonomy to determine on their own what they should do and what sort of persons they should be (pp. 20-1, 25). All God can do is provide evidence of his existence that will “woo” people to him and allow human suffering as a way to “nudge us to attend to otherwise neglected evidence in conscience of divine expectations for us” (pp. 243, 246). Like a skilled dietician who tailors diets to the nutritional needs of each individual, God will tailor his revelation to the spiritual needs of each individual, presumably presenting different amounts of evidence to different individuals.

Further, Moser lays the blame for people not being aware of God on the people themselves. Because we are selfish, prideful, and fearful of losing worldly goods, including our reputations and acceptance by peers, we don’t want to attend to the available evidence of God’s existence; we do not want willingly to receive it. Moser compares us to someone who has his ham radio tuned to the wrong frequency and so does not hear the message from God that is being broadcast on a different channel (pp. 113-18). Perhaps a better comparison would be with a man who has glued his own eyelids shut and cannot by himself open them. He will have no evidence of the existence and nature of the chandelier that hangs over his head, even though he could if he would allow a benevolent surgeon to open his eyes. For Moser, we are like this man. Through pride, selfishness, and fear of loss of worldly goods, we have glued shut our eyes to see God. We cannot through our own unaided wills open them, and we often do not ask God’s help in opening them. So we lack evidence of God’s existence. However, if we are truly willing to be in union with Him, he will perform the needed surgery. Of course, once he has done that we can still fail to look up. We can, so to speak, turn away so that we do not receive the visual sensations that would provide evidence of the chandelier (see Moser, pp. 5-6). Given our free will, we can ignore, dismiss, or withhold judgment even if we are aware of the evidence for God’s existence, and we can disobey what it asks of us (see p. 24 for these alternatives). But God could not be faulted if we adopted any of those alternatives.

Nevertheless it seems that a good parent would eventually provide compelling evidence that she exists if knowledge of her existence is required to keep her children alive. So, in the end, why doesn’t God make his existence “blazingly clear” by some sort of “heavenly fireworks” for those who have not responded to his subtle call (pp. 13, 260)? Of course, even then some will rebel against him and others will ignore or dismiss the evidence. But some won’t, and like a good parent, God would want to save as many of his children as possible from the human predicament of destructive selfishness and death. For some, it is enough for God to broadcast his message on some ham radio frequency and let them find it. For others who have failed to find his message, he should tell them what frequency to tune to, since not hearing his message will mean death to those people. Moser can’t reply that such overwhelming evidence of God’s existence would coerce people into believing in him, for he allows that it is always possible for people with free will to turn away from the evidence or rebel against what it requires.

Moser’s book reads like part of a crusade to get people to give up their selfish ways and turn to God who, according to Moser, is the only answer to the human predicament of being morally deficient and finite. For him, only a relationship to God can turn one’s heart and replace despair over death with hope for eternal life. He is so committed to what he sees as God’s call to love one another that he thinks that philosophers should not waste their time on anything that will not ultimately contribute to people being open to God’s call and giving up their selfish and prideful ways (pp. 227, 229, 231, 234-35, 239-40).

It was brave of Moser to write The Elusive God, for he recognizes that it is a radical book, offering what many philosophers will take to be unconvincing evidential reasons for belief in God and unconvincing practical reasons for having a relationship to God, as well as proposing a radical view of what the aims and goals of philosophy should be (p. 239). By writing this overly long book (it could easily be cut in half) with the content it has, Moser puts his own philosophical reputation at risk, which I believe he realizes but does not care about because it has little value in comparison to what he believes God has called him, and everyone, to do. I hope that those who read his book, especially agnostics and atheists, will not be deterred from reading his other work in epistemology, for I am in almost complete agreement with his non-doxastic evidentialism that has non-propositional experiences as its foundations and inference to the best explanation providing support for beliefs based on those experiences. It’s Moser’s application of that general view to the issue of belief in God that I find problematic. He sees evidence and good God-invoking explanations of religious experiences where I see none. No doubt he will attribute this to my spiritual blindness, and that, ultimately, to my selfishness and pridefulness. Of course, I think that his views about theistic evidence and explanation rest on wishful thinking. What should epistemic peers do when they so profoundly disagree? That is a topic for another essay.