The Emergence of Autonomy in Kant's Moral Philosophy

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Stefano Bacin and Oliver Sensen (eds.), The Emergence of Autonomy in Kant's Moral Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 226pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107182851.

Reviewed by Paul Formosa, Macquarie University


Stefano Bacin and Oliver Sensen, the editors of this book, briefly outline Kant's account of autonomy in three claims. First, our own reason gives the content of the moral law. It is not something outside of us, whether God's will or custom, or something heteronomous inside us, such as a moral sense or a feeling of pleasure, that determines the content of the moral law. It is our own reason that lays down the moral law for us. Second, our own reason makes the moral law obligatory or binding for us. The reason we should be moral is because our own reason commands us to obey the law. Third, reason can be motivating in and of itself. We can be moved to action by our recognition of a moral obligation and through respect for the moral law. We can be directly motivated by what our own reason says we ought to do. However, all this no doubt seems very familiar and is covered in the first few pages of the introduction. What more needs to be said? Faced with yet another book or article on Kant's account of autonomy, one might reasonably ask: do we need another? Isn't Kant's account of autonomy now sufficiently well understood?

Our contemporary familiarity with Kant's idea of moral autonomy has dulled our sense of its innovativeness. By taking autonomy out of the political sphere and into the moral sphere for the first-time, Kant helped to fundamentally change how we understand morality and our relationship to it. But this innovation didn't come out of nowhere. It has a detailed origin story and knowing this story can help us in understanding Kant's view on autonomy. Kant first published his mature account of autonomy in his 1785 Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, which he wrote in 1784. But before that Kant held various incompatible views about morality, and his account of autonomy emerges only gradually through his engagement with the philosophical tradition and his attempts to overcome certain philosophical problems within that tradition. This raises various questions. How does Kant's Groundwork account of autonomy emerge? In which texts or lectures? And why does it emerge? How do Kant's views of morality change over time? Why does it take him so long to develop his account of autonomy? What are his precursor views? Why does he change his mind? What philosophical issues and problems was Kant trying to solve? The first nine chapters of this volume attempt to answer these and related questions by focusing on a rich variety of texts, notes and lectures. Once we understand where Kant's 1785 account of autonomy comes from and why, we can also ask what is that account of autonomy and how (if at all) Kant develops and changes that account over time. Since this is much more familiar territory, these issues are only addressed in the last two chapters. With the basic structure and motivation of the book now clear, we shall briefly look at each chapter.

In chapter 1, Heiner F. Klemme focuses on Kant's attempt to solve the problem of moral obligation. How is moral obligation possible? If the basis of morality is happiness, custom or feeling, how can morality categorically command our obedience? Trying to answer this question eventually leads Kant to the idea of autonomy. Klemme illustrates this progress by examining Kant's response to the rationalist views held by Wolff and Pufendorf and the attempts of young Wolffians, such as Eberhard and Lord Kames, to integrate Wolffian perfectionism with British moral sense theorists such as Hutchinson. Klemme focuses on how Wolff's idea of autocracy is developed by Kant in his account of autonomy. For Wolff, cognition of the external law of nature is sufficient motivation to act in accordance with it. But is cognition of an external law really enough to motivate us? This worry led the young Wolffians to argue that reason can only move us to action if it presents itself to us through feeling as well. Klemme shows how Kant responds to this debate by developing his account of respect for the moral law as a bridge between our reason and feelings.

Next, Susan Meld Shell focuses on Kant's writings from the 1750s and the mid-1760s to see what, if any, of his latter account of autonomy is already present in these earlier texts. Shell focuses on Kant's early cosmological writings in the 1750s and his early 1760s engagement with the perfectionist ethics of Wolff and British moral sense theorists. She traces Kant's struggles with perfectionism, rationalism and moral sense theory in this period and his difficulties in developing a satisfying account of moral motivation. Shell argues that it is only with the development of his critical philosophy in the late 1770s/early 1780s, which establishes the lawgiving power of the understanding, that Kant finally has the foundations from which he can develop his mature conception of autonomy.

Stefano Bacin looks at Kant's criticism of moral rationalism in his lectures from the early 1760s to the composition of the Groundwork. He outlines Kant's standard taxonomy of moral views from this period. In Kant's taxonomy, there are ancient views, which focus on virtue and the highest good, and modern views, which focus on the principle of morality. Bacin outlines the various objections that Kant develops in this period both to modern rationalist views, including the perfectionism of Wolff and the theological view of Crusius, and to empiricist moral sense theories. Bacin argues that it was partly Kant's attempts to overcome the perceived weaknesses of these earlier views, while maintaining their strengths, that led him towards his mature conception of autonomy.

Georg Mohr focuses on Kant's objections to and engagement with moral sense theorists in his works from the early 1760s up to the Groundwork. Mohr argues that Kant, while initially sympathetic to moral sense theories in the early to mid-1760s, attempts to combine elements from both rationalist and empiricist views in the 1770s. This necessitates a focus on the role that feelings and emotions play in moral motivation and leads to Kant's idea that reason itself can be a motivating force through a moral feeling of respect that follows from, rather than precedes, consciousness of the moral law.

Oliver Sensen focuses on Kant's Lectures on Ethics during his "silent period" in the 1770s which led up to his development of autonomy in the mid-1780s. Sensen argues that Kant develops certain elements of his mature conception of autonomy during this period. He argues that by the mid-1770s Kant had already come to the view that reason provides the content of the moral law. However, Kant also seems, at times, to side with Pufendorf's claim that even though reason can discover the moral law, it is God's will that makes morality obligatory, although Sensen argues that other passages from the mid-1770s support the view that Kant had already developed the idea that our own rational capacities, not God, could bind us to the moral law. But Kant does not develop in this period the final pillar of his conception of autonomy, namely that reason by itself can be motivating, which explains why he does not mention autonomy in this period.

Jens Timmermann focuses on the account of ethics that Kant develops in 1781 in the "Canon of Pure Reason" in the first Critique and in the relevant lectures from the early to mid-1780s. This crucial period occurs after the development of Kant's critical philosophy but before his introduction of the concept of moral autonomy. Drawing on these difference sources, Timmermann shows that while key elements of Kant's account of autonomy are already present, namely that morality is grounded in pure reason and is by itself unconditionally binding, Kant had not yet developed the final element in terms of the motivating force of internalising the moral law and regarding it as self-legislated. In the Canon, Kant still maintains a motivating role for divine threats and punishments which means that his pre-Groundwork account cannot deliver on its promise to ground the universality of morality.

Eric Watkins examines another key early 1780s text, Kant's Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics from 1783. Watkins focuses on the similarities between Kant's account in that text of the way in which the understanding prescribes laws to nature in the theoretical sphere, with Kant's latter account of the way in which reason prescribes laws to rational beings in the practical sphere. Of course, an obvious difference is that while we ought to obey moral laws, we may still disobey them, whereas we cannot "disobey" laws of nature. Nonetheless, while acknowledging these differences, Watkins makes a strong case for the similarities too, which lends support to his conclusion that the Prolegomena account of theoretical reason helps to explain the emergence of Kant's practical account of autonomy in the Groundwork.

Marcus Willaschek focuses on the "Introduction" to the Feyerabend lecture notes on Kant's course on natural right, which he taught in 1784 at roughly the same time as he was writing the Groundwork. These lecture notes are significant since, Willaschek claims, they contain the first securely dated use of the term "autonomy" in the context of Kant's moral philosophy. Willaschek carefully charts the close similarities between the account of autonomy developed in those lectures and the familiar account found in the Groundwork.

Pauline Kleingeld continues the focus on the Feyerabend lecture notes. Given the political origins of the concept of autonomy, Kant's debts to Rousseau's political philosophy are often mentioned. But Kleingeld instead focuses on the account of political philosophy that Kant develops in his 1784 lectures on natural right, and she uses this to undermine any concerns about the voluntaristic implications of Kant's account of autonomy. In his political philosophy of 1784, Kant develops a counterfactual test whereby laws legislated for the people are legitimate only if the people, who retain ultimate sovereignty, could (not do or would) have consented to imposing the law on themselves. Kleingeld aptly notes that "the agent who regards himself as legislating universal law through maxims . . . seems to be the moral analogue of the political legislator who ought only to give laws that the people . . . could impose upon themselves" (171). Just as the counterfactual test provides a test for the permissibility of a positive law in a political context, the moral law provides a test for the permissibility of one's maxims, even though the underlying moral law is not the result of anything the person bound by it does. This political analogy thus helps to show why Kant's concept of moral autonomy does not have voluntaristic implications.

Andrews Reath sets out his reading of Kant's conception of autonomy in the Groundwork. Reath defends what he calls a narrow reading of autonomy as the thesis that the will, or practical reason, is a law to itself, which means that "the nature of rational volition is the source of its formal principle" (186). This demonstrates "Kant's great insight" (186) that moral requirements apply unconditionally only if they are based on a formal principle internal to reason itself. Everything else is heteronomy.

Finally, Pierre Keller examines how Kant's conception of autonomy progresses and broadens after the Groundwork in the 1790s in the third Critique and Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View. Keller shows why Kant ascribes autonomy to the three higher faculties of understanding, judgment and desire by identifying the way that each faculty allows sensibility to be shaped by an a priori principle.

This volume has a comprehensiveness and coherence to it that is not always present in edited collections. Each contribution is sufficiently distinct while also covering an important part of the picture. No obviously important primary source has been missed and there is little repetition between the chapters. Part of this coherence is no doubt due to the book's resulting from a series of workshops in which the authors first discussed Kant's texts and then preliminary versions of their papers. But it is also surely due to the excellent work of Bacin and Sensen . The book covers all the obvious and important precursors, and some less obvious ones, in a careful and systematic way. Overall, the contributions paint a compelling account of the origins of Kant's concept of autonomy. The contributors are all established and well-known Kant scholars, although perhaps a little more gender parity among contributors would have been welcome.

The volume will be mostly of interest to Kant scholars. It would function less well as an introduction to Kant's idea of autonomy but, to be fair, that is not the book's goal. It is thus not the best book for a more general audience who are simply after the basics of Kant's account of autonomy. But for those interested in the details of how Kant came to develop his view of autonomy, and the various precursor views he developed and engaged with on the way there, this book is an excellent and welcome addition to the literature.