The Emotional Construction of Morals

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Jesse Prinz, The Emotional Construction of Morals, Oxford University Press, 2007, 334pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199283019.

Reviewed by Ronald de Sousa, University of Toronto


Is the good a projection of our preferences, or are our preferences correct or incorrect according to their correspondence to some objective good, independent of our minds? The question goes back to Plato's Euthyphro. There have been major hitters on both sides, and it is one of the many scandals of philosophy that the debate drags on. Jesse Prinz's brilliant new book is a detailed and convincing defense of a fresh variant of the projectionist view, in which emotional responses, particularly approbation and disapprobation, constitute the core content of moral judgments. The view is refined in such a way as to embrace the possibility of moral truth, and answer a large array of objections. Its relativist consequences are embraced, and independently supported with a wide range of psychological and anthropological evidence. Prinz shows, however, that even full fledged relativism does not exclude viable notions of moral debate and moral progress.

Two core doctrines, roughly corresponding to the book's two parts, are inspired respectively by Hume and Nietzsche. From Hume Prinz adopts the view that moral judgments are essentially expressions of approbation or disapprobation. This is elaborated in such a way, however, that moral judgments also express factual content. Like Nietzsche Prinz endorses a genealogical approach, though not Nietzsche's specific genealogical speculations. He also rejects absolute foundational principles and the traditional assumption that moral values trump all others.

To these approaches Prinz brings many refinements, which allow him neatly to circumvent most of the objections in the canon. Take, first, the classic objection to the strong internalism that views an emotional response as inherent to the sincere endorsement of a moral judgment. This objection, long ago pressed by Peter Geach, Bernard Williams and others, adduces the impossibility of conditionalizing moral judgments. If the very meaning of p is good includes approval of p, one cannot use the proposition in the antecedent of a conditional without either changing its meaning or committing one to the consequent. For consider the following inference:

1. If p is good then you should do X.

2. p is good.

3. Therefore you should do X.

Does (1) commit the speaker to approving of p? If so, then the inference to the consequent is short-circuited: premise (2) is redundant. But if not, then the sentence "p is good" does not have its normal meaning in (1).

Prinz avoids this problem by denying that moral judgments are mere expressions of feeling, lacking representational content. "When we say 'That's wrong!' we convey our feelings and also aim to assert a fact… . Moral wrongness … is the property of being the object of disapprobation" (100). The upshot is a subtle, two-tier account of representational content. What are expressed in moral judgments are not just emotions but sentiments, which are "dispositions whose occurrent manifestations … are emotions" (84). Both emotions and sentiments represent, but they have different objects. Sentiments represent secondary qualities, caused by properties of situations that elicit the emotional response. The emotions themselves do not represent secondary qualities; they "represent concerns" (85; 101). Thus fear represents danger, while the sentiment that is the phobia represents the property that causes the fear response: "when you have a phobic reaction to something you are simultaneously attributing to that thing the property of being scary and the property of being dangerous, which is the representational content of fear" (101). An interesting consequence of this doctrine of double representation is that there are no "thin concepts" expressing pure (dis)approval. Moral concepts express sentiments, not emotions, and while an emotion can be one of pure disapproval, the sentiment relating to it categorises its object as the kind of thing that occasions disapproval.

Prinz labels his fully elaborated view "constructive sentimentalism". The term underlines that morality is not, contrary to the view of moral nihilists like John Mackie, a mere projection of a subjective state. It consists in rules set up by sentiments, and these rules, like other social constructions such as money, have a perfectly objective existence independent of any particular person's subjective attitudes at any particular time. Indeed, it allows that an individual's actual emotional response at a particular time may fail to conform to that same individual's own values (96). I may quite genuinely love my daughter even when I fail, under the influence of stress, unusual provocation, or a momentary chemical imbalance, to respond lovingly to her demands.

Prinz's view of representation, derived from Fred Dretske, allows moral wrongness to be a genuine (albeit secondary) property. "When we say 'That's wrong!' we convey our feelings and also aim to assert a fact" (100). The most basic form of representation is modeled on perception which Prinz rather tendentiously implies is not a form of cognition, apparently on the ground that non-conceptual detection suffices (61). A perception of X is a response that has the function of detecting X, i.e. one selected to indicate the presence of X. This line on representation allows Prinz to side with James and Lange on the bodily causes of emotional feeling, while circumventing the objection that this makes the bodily state into the object of the feeling. If sadness is the feeling of certain bodily changes which evolved to signal loss, then loss is what sadness represents, even when it is caused not by actual loss but by music or by serotonin deficiency. "Emotions are reliably caused by bodily changes but they represent things such as loss and danger … . [E]motions represent concerns" (63).

There is a notorious problem lurking here, affecting the exact location of error in the perceptual causal chains described as Dretskean detection devices: has the frog's brain evolved to detect bugs, or has it evolved to detect moving black spots because those are generally identical with bugs? The non-conceptual nature of some emotional response evades this problem. In practical terms, the answer makes no difference to the fly. It's only when we start to talk about it that we can make the distinction. Similarly, we might say, when someone reacts with disgust to the very idea of stem cell research, we needn't fault the bodily processes that cause this response, but we can point to the inappropriateness of the implied identification, in this case, between stem cell research and the sorts of harms from which the disgust response evolved to protect us.

The second half of the book is devoted to an independent defense of the relativism entailed by constructive sentimentalism. If it's a necessary and sufficient condition of X's being good/evil that X be the object of "our" approval/disapproval, then clearly one and the same X can be both good and evil, depending on who is talking. Prinz distinguishes "content relativism", according to which an utterance's meaning depends on its context of utterance, from truth relativism, which holds that truth may vary though content does not (180-2). Content relativism effectively introduces an indexical element into moral judgments: what is right depends on which actual individual is speaking -- though every individual judgment and every morality is necessarily embedded in a cultural context. Clearly there may be problems here about the identification of the 'we' whose judgment and culture are presupposed. But leaving that aside, it's clear that if some approve and others disapprove (all things being equal and after having subjected our respective sentiments to the most thoroughgoing process of reflective equilibrium), there will be multiple incompatible truths. This is undoubtedly the most difficult idea to reconcile with philosophical orthodoxy. To make sense of it, it helps to look at analogies between morality and both science and aesthetics.

In morality as in science, we are all on Neurath's raft, rebuilding while afloat (289). There is no transcendent point of view. Neither are there any foundational certainties. Instead there are degrees of centrality in a web of belief. Individual truths can shift in their relative position with time and circumstance. Thus the Euclidian character of three-dimensional space was once close to bedrock and has now shifted to falsehood. Similarly slavery and tribal revenge killing have now shifted, for suitably circumscribed "us", from acceptable to unconscionable.

A crucial disanalogy remains, reflected in the widely shared intuition that the objective truth about Euclidian space hasn't changed with our opinions, whereas the parallel claim about slavery is contested. But this is where the analogy of aesthetic debate might help. Aesthetic values, like moral ones, are response based; but that doesn't preclude debate. Aesthetic disputes can appeal to facts (it's not original but plagiarized), or draw attention to particular features (listen to the way the two melodies answer one another) or ways of seeing something (look at it as an abstract pattern). Similar considerations apply to moral matters, and so, as Prinz stresses, it in no way follows from relativism that moral debate is futile.

Another line of argument in aesthetics is especially pertinent. A precondition of agreement or disagreement is convergence of experience. Think of degrees of mind-dependence as defining a continuum: at the objective end lies what is completely mind-independent, at the subjective, what depends entirely on a single experience. Individual taste is at the latter end. If I like oysters and you don't, must our preferences differ? Not necessarily: I could maintain that your experience of oysters must be different from mine; for to me they taste salty, smooth, soft, and pleasant. So if they tasted the same to you, you would like them.

It's a notable consequence of Prinz's Humean approach that this story can't be necessarily true. It must be possible for two people to differ only in their evaluation of a given experience while agreeing on all factual qualities. Prinz argues against Michelle Moody-Adams's contention that apparent disagreements about fundamental moral issues can always be traced to differences in non-moral belief. There is little hope of settling the issue empirically, not only because of the elusiveness of the relevant qualitative experiences, but especially because of the complexity of the background beliefs that would need to line up to prove that residual differences were exclusively evaluative. Moreover, the indexical character of moral judgment opens the way to an argument often used to trivialize Kant's categorical imperative: if the maxim of my act is "steal", I may not be willing to will it to be a universal law of nature, but I maybe have no such scruples if the maxim is rephrased as "take what's not yours under circumstances similar to the present in all respects". Similarly, if the content of my judgment depends on who we are, it's not clear that its falsity for me should give me any reason to deny its truth for you. This would declaw relativism to the point of triviality.

This may not matter, given that purely evaluative disagreements must at least be possible, and that both anthropology and evolutionary psychology, as Prinz shows, seem amply to support the view that irreducible disagreements are real, if only as they motivate practices. Like languages, moralities are constructed out of universal capacities, to form a great variety of mutually incompatible specific forms. (Moralities are not innate, but "epigenetic" (9).) But just as we can learn a foreign language well enough to disagree, so I can be sure enough that when a tribesman claims it is his moral duty to kill his daughter for the sake of "honor", his and my disapprobation conflict.

What are the underlying capacities that enable divergent moralities to be so reliably constructed? Prinz argues that they must be simpler and more general than the "modules", such as sexual jealousy, favored by some evolutionary psychologists. He's inclined to identify them with the small number of emotions often identified (though the exact lists differ widely) as "basic": "Our basic emotions get reused in novel ways to create new emotions." Nostalgia, for example, is a "blend of joy and sadness directed at the past" (67). This might well be right; but he also speaks more modestly on the same page of "bodily responses". To my mind, it's more likely that the building blocks in question are responses even simpler than anything we'd be prepared to call an emotion. Even "basic emotions" might be highly constructed.

With characteristic panache, Prinz taxes the great moral philosophers with "usurping" morality, and then recruits them to work as underlings. If the core meaning of 'morally good' is "gives rise to approbation", the foundational absolutes of the classical philosophers are just failed rival definitions (306). (Against any substantive definition of 'good', Prinz endorses Moore's open question argument, ingeniously merged with a version of Frank Jackson's thought experiment about Mary, now emotionally inert rather than color-blind (38ff).) Universalisability, welfare, or eudaimonia are failures as definitions of the moral good, but "consistency, stability, well-being, and even conformity to biological norms are things we value in an extramoral sense" (292). All can be used, among other non-moral values, as important sources of argument in debating revisionist proposals in morality. "Everything we care about is potentially relevant in deciding how to improve our current system of morals" (293). This nicely reverses the hegemonic status of morality. Far from its being the case that morality trumps all other values, any other value may contribute to unseating a moral claim. Kant, Mill and Aristotle were wrong to think moral value could be defined as universality, welfare, or thriving in accordance with nature; but as non-moral values, these can help us to assess competing claims for reforming morality (303).

Once non-moral values are thrown into the lists along with moral values, the status of the latter is determined by the intensity of first-order emotions and their endorsement by second-order ones. The question of morality's scope is up for debate (113). From the descriptive anthropology and psychology of moral sentiments, Prinz has inferred that moral rules are constructed from separable emotional raw materials to construct relatively independent domains. Western liberal morality emphasises rights, fairness and the avoidance of harm, and is grounded in emotional responses to failures of reciprocity and empathy for suffering. But most non-Western cultures and indeed our own social reality involve ideas of "purity", "sacredness" and "authority" constructed from primitive disgust and animal dominance. Since the latter can be equally intense, Prinz taxes the liberal West with "moral myopia" for downplaying the importance of such values as authority, purity, and sacredness. "We live in a world of class, authority and norms of respect … kinship rules and sexual propriety. The morality of daily life may have more to do with these than with harms, rights or justice" (304-5). On his own view of moral argument as driven by non-moral considerations, however, there is room for a defense of such "moral myopia". When politicians see themselves as duty-bound to legislate morality, the non-moral values of welfare and Aristotelian thriving are more likely to be promoted in a state where purity, sacredness and rank are demoted, confining morality, like law itself, to the relatively restricted domains of fairness, harm-avoidance and rights. When thus reduced in status, those values can still be accorded a place in private and social life on pragmatic grounds, like etiquette or traffic rules. But in the pluralist societies that most of the world increasingly lives in, when purity, sacredness and rank are accorded the kind of reverence they receive in more traditional societies, the practical consequences are all too often inapt to elicit my approving sentiments.