The Emotions of the Ancient Greeks: Studies in Aristotle and Classical Literature

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David Konstan, The Emotions of the Ancient Greeks: Studies in Aristotle and Classical Literature, University of Toronto Press, 2006, 422pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 0802091032.

Reviewed by Robert A. Kaster, Princeton University


This book was not written by a philosopher, nor is it being reviewed by one. David Konstan and I are both classicists by training, though Konstan has also written extensively on both the emotions and ancient philosophy,[1] while I have recently published another book on the emotions in classical antiquity.[2] That we both have found ourselves working the same corner of the vineyard is testimony to the hold that the emotions have increasingly had on scholarly attention in a range of fields over the last generation, with (it can fairly be said) philosophy of mind leading the way in several important respects. Much of this increased attention can be attributed to an increased sensitivity to the role of cognition in emotion. There is now broad consensus (though certainly not universal agreement) that while the capacity to experience a range of emotions is innate in our species, the actual experience of any given emotion is determined by the judgments and beliefs that engage it, giving it its 'aboutness'. And since judgments and beliefs are products of culture, even emotions that seem to 'match up' cross-culturally -- English 'anger' with Latin 'ira' with Greek 'orgê' -- are liable to differ in more or less marked ways that are culturally revealing.

Hence the starting point of this richly detailed, superbly informed, carefully argued, and very important book:

The premise of this book is that the emotions of the ancient Greeks were in some significant respects different from our own, and that recognizing these differences is important to our understanding of Greek literature and culture generally… . I [also] argue that the Greeks' conception of the emotions has something to tell us about our own views, whether about the nature of particular emotions or the category of emotion itself. (ix)

Returning to the Greeks for a historical exploration of the emotions makes sense, not just because their extensive literature is chock full of emotions vibrantly on display, but also because Greek culture gave the West its first analytical survey of the emotions, in the second book of Aristotle's Rhetoric. There, along with analyses of rhetorical (as opposed to philosophical) argument and of ethos (the character of the speaker) as means of persuasion, Aristotle offers a long discussion of the emotions (Gk. pathê, cognate with Engl. 'passions') -- 'those things that cause people to change their minds in respect of their judgments and are accompanied by pleasure and pain' -- which a speaker should find it useful to stir in his audience when speaking either in court or on matters of public policy. The survey comprises eleven emotions, each discussed in terms of its characteristic 'disposition of mind', the persons toward whom it is usually felt, and the occasions that prompt it. To know how to stir an emotion, Aristotle in effect says, you must know what the emotion is about, and to know what it is about you must know what the people engaged in the relevant transaction are thinking: for example, 'let anger be [= let us define anger as] a desire, accompanied by pain, for what appears to be revenge for what appears to be a slight by people for whom it was not proper to slight oneself or someone close to one'. Understood in this way, the emotion depends on two central and complex judgments -- what constitutes a slight? and what categories of person cannot appropriately slight one? -- as well as some secondary but no less complex judgments (what constitutes revenge? who is or is not 'close to one'?).

Aristotle's strongly cognitivist approach perfectly suits Konstan's project and explains the emphasis in the book's subtitle, 'Studies in Aristotle and Classical Literature', which also hints at the procedure that Konstan follows throughout. After the first chapter, which surveys past and present theories of emotion in a remarkably thorough yet readable way, the next nine chapters take up, typically one at a time, most of the emotions that Aristotle treats (though not in the order he treats them).[3] In each case Konstan first works carefully through Aristotle's analysis, to be certain that we are clear about the kind of emotion that is under discussion and about the main points in Aristotle's analysis, producing finely nuanced interpretations overall and, in a couple of cases, fundamental readjustments in our grasp of the emotion at issue (thus 'satisfaction' and 'gratitude' vs. 'mildness' and 'kindliness').[4] He then compares the Aristotelian understanding with the implied understanding found in various contemporary or nearly contemporary Greek texts (especially tragedy and the Greek orators), in effect testing the former against the latter and emerging along the way with some splendid new readings of familiar texts (though these are likely to be of more interest to classicists than to philosophers). In the last two chapters (11-12), by contrast, Konstan takes up two emotions that Aristotle omits -- jealousy and grief -- before rounding the book off with a brief and helpful conclusion. And 'helpful' is indeed the right epithet for the approach throughout, for Konstan has clearly taken pains to insure that his arguments and exposition, however technical they might be at times, can be understood by non-specialists, even when much depends on the meaning to be ascribed to Greek words; all quotations in languages other than English (including quotations from secondary sources) are translated.

Given the richness of the work and the space available, it would be pointless to attempt to summarize the argument of each chapter in any detail. So let me summarize instead what I take to be Konstan's main and, in my view, mainly successful arguments, before I note the only significant argument in which I find myself unable to follow him.

The great strength of Aristotle's analysis (Konstan says) is not that he gets the emotions absolutely 'right' where others get them absolutely 'wrong', but that '[his] approach … better describes what the emotions meant in the social life of the classical city state', which provides the 'narrative context' for his account (28). In one sense, to be sure, Aristotle writes for a very narrow purpose: to influence the judgments of people listening to forensic or deliberative oratory. Yet for that purpose to be realized, his analyses must connect with the lives that the notional jurymen and council members led beyond the court and the assembly. Those lives were lived in a world that was

intensely confrontational, intensely competitive, and intensely public, … in which everybody [knew] that they [were] constantly being judged, nobody [hid] that they [were] acting like judges, and nobody [hid] that they [sought] to be judged positively. (Jon Elster quoted on p. 75, here slightly abridged, with tenses adjusted for context)

In this world, emotion was experienced not so much as an inner state, the agitation of a private, privileged self, but first and foremost as a reaction to public encounters in which every actor's social self was at stake: '[i]f Aristotle subsumes emotion[s] under rhetoric, then, it is in part because their effect on judgment was for him a primary feature of emotions in the daily negotiation of social roles' (34). This is part of the reason, for example, that Aristotle's 'anger' is 'reducible to … a desire for revenge; that this desire is provoked by a slight -- and only a slight; and that some people, but only some, are not fit to slight [you]' (43).[5] Being the sort of citizen who participated in the civic life of Athens entailed a sensitivity, not to say outright touchiness, when it came to being granted every jot of respect to which one believed one was entitled.[6]

Aristotle, then, writes for

a world in which self-esteem depends on social interaction: the moment someone's negative opinion of your worth is actualized publicly in the form of a slight, you have lost credit, and the only recourse is a compensatory act [i.e., revenge in anger] that restores your social position. (74f.)

Such interactions explain (for example) why the opposite of 'anger' in Aristotle's account is correctly understood not as 'mildness' but (Konstan compellingly shows, 77ff.) as 'satisfaction';[7] why 'shame' (91ff.) is the necessary consequence when compensation is not forthcoming; why 'envy' -- a response to apparently discrepant status between persons who are nominally peers -- is an exploitable constant in the emotional repertoire, useful for preserving the proper hierarchical relations in society (121); why 'fear' depended especially on a shrewd and careful judgment of the competitors' capabilities (129ff., esp. 139ff.); why 'gratitude', understood as 'a passion to pay back a favor' (164), impelled one to escape from the condition of being a debtor, which is to say, an inferior; and why 'between Greek pity and modern English sympathy there is a wide cultural divide' (213), insofar as pity 'did not mean identifying with the experience of another' but was possible only insofar as one was separate from, and superior to, that experience. In sum:

It would appear that the Greeks were constantly jockeying to maintain or improve their social position or that of dear ones, and were deeply conscious of their standing in the eyes of others. When ordinary people stepped out of the house and into the streets of Athens, they must … have been intensely aware of relative degrees of power and their own vulnerability to insult and injury. The emotions of the ancient Greeks, in turn, were attuned to these demands. (259)

I believe that Konstan gets all this about as right as we are able to get it. It is a painstakingly constructed picture, and it fits with what we know more generally about the Greeks (especially, the Athenians) of the classical period. It even fits with my sense of an important difference between the Greeks and the Romans, for the latter -- though intensely competitive themselves -- seem overall readier to cut each other a bit of slack.

But from this picture of an intensely competitive world, one expectable piece is (if Konstan is right) rather surprisingly missing: for not only does Aristotle omit 'jealousy' from his survey of the emotions, but (Konstan argues) 'ancient Greeks of the classical period may not have known jealousy at all, in the modern romantic sense of the word' (220). Indeed, he suggests that 'romantic jealousy' is nowhere represented in any ancient text until the 20s BCE, when the poet Horace speaks in the persona of what we would call a 'jealous lover' (Odes 1.13, pp. 238ff.). Can this be right?

Even granting that affective relations among the classical Greeks did not include companionate marriages of the modern, Western ideal, I'm unable to persuade myself that this argument is correct, for two main reasons that are perhaps worth considering. First, the argument is narrowed down so quickly to, specifically, 'romantic jealousy' that we never get a proper sense of the structure of 'jealousy' overall (the argument in essence takes off from the Oxford English Dictionary's general definition of 'jealousy' as 'the state of mind arising from the suspicion, apprehension, or knowledge of a rivalry' -- which seems to me inadequate on several grounds -- and from the specific definition applied to amatory relations, 'fear of being supplanted in the affection, or distrust of the fidelity, of a beloved person, esp. a wife, husband, or lover'). If one were to attempt an Aristotelian definition of 'jealousy', I think it would look something like this:

Let jealousy be a desire, accompanied by pain, to retain a good that you take to be properly yours alone, when another appears to be gaining it or you have the impression he might gain it.[8]

The definition has several points to commend it. For one thing, it is in accord with the intuition of modern commentators on jealousy (220f.) that the emotion is something of a hybrid: it resembles anger because it is 'a desire, accompanied by pain', that arises in response to a perceived wrong (because you take the good to be properly yours); it resembles fear because it can be engaged not just by a perceived wrong but also by the 'impression of a future evil that is destructive or painful' (thus, in part, Aristotle's definition of fear); and it resembles envy and emulation because it concerns the allocation and possession of a good. At the same time, however, it is clearly and uniquely itself, centered on the distinct thought, 'this good I have is rightly mine, and no one else's'; and that thought is plainly on the mind of both Othello, the modern archetype of the 'jealous spouse', and (say) a scholar 'jealous of' his standing as the pre-eminent expert in Proust.

It is also a thought that we should expect to have occurred to the highly competitive Greeks; and indeed, from the material Konstan generously gathers, it is quite clear that the classical Greeks did know the thought and the emotion, and clear too that they used the word zêlotupia, commonly if not exclusively,[9] to denote it, including the two earliest attested uses of the term, at Aristophanes Wealth 1013-16 (222f.) and Plato Symposium 213C8-D4 (228). The latter passage runs as follows (in Konstan's translation), as Socrates characterizes the behavior of the beautiful Alcibiades: 'From the time I became his lover, I can no longer look at or talk with a single pretty fellow, or else he feels zêlotupia and envy [phthonos], does outlandish things, insults me, and barely keeps his hands off me'. Alcibiades' zêlotupia does look to me very much like the 'jealousy' defined above.[10]

Ah, but is that sort of 'jealousy' the same thing as 'modern, romantic jealousy'? To answer the question, let's rephrase it in terms of 'the good' at issue: did the Greeks in fact recognize as a good the same good that figures in 'modern, romantic jealousy'? There are at least two ways to approach the question. Taking one approach, we might cite (for example) Lysias 1.32-33, where the speaker refers to a law holding that seducers deserve more severe punishment than rapists, because seducers 'corrupt the soul in such a way as to make other men's wives care more for them than for their own husbands' (234); and we might then suggest that the talk of 'soul' and 'care' there does indeed point to the sort of good relevant to 'romantic jealousy', that the speaker is concerned with what we would call 'alienation of affection' (because the speaker goes on to note that adultery leaves the paternity of children in doubt, Konstan argues that '[i]t is not so much his wife's love that the speaker is concerned for as the integrity of his home'; I would say it is plainly both). But another, perhaps more productive way to approach the question is to ask, 'what, exactly, is the good that is relevant to "modern, romantic jealousy"?'; and this brings me to the second main reason why I cannot persuade myself that Konstan's argument is correct. Throughout the argument, the person in the grip of 'romantic jealousy' is taken to be concerned only with the 'affection' of the beloved: but surely 'affection' is too thin a concept adequately to account for the 'modern' emotion.[11] Mere affection, even great affection, need not entail either respect or loyalty (my great affection for my dog does not require that I respect him in any meaningful sense; my great affection for the University of Chicago did not block my accepting a position at Princeton). Yet in the typical case both respect and loyalty are plainly as relevant to 'modern' jealousy as affection, and I see no reason to insist a priori that any one of these elements is more important than the others. In fact, I suggest that we come closer to identifying the good that is relevant to 'modern' jealousy if we replace 'the other's affection' and/or 'loyalty' and/or 'respect' with 'the other's full commitment to oneself'. If that is roughly correct, then the distance between 'modern' emotion and ancient culture becomes vanishingly small.

But to dissent from one argument in a book so rich in argument is less a criticism than a measure of the book's success. Its introductory chapter will be immensely useful for anyone seeking an efficient survey of past and present views of the emotions across the disciplines, and each of the succeeding chapters will long be required reading for students either of Aristotle or of the various emotions. It is, overall, a splendid achievement and a resource of lasting value.

[1] See esp. Some Aspects of Epicurean Psychology (Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1973), Simplicius on Aristotle Physics 6 (London: Duckworth, 1989), Friendship in the Classical World (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997), Philodemus: On Frank Criticism (Atlanta, GA: Scholars Press, 1998), Commentators on Aristotle on Friendship: Aspasius, Anonymous, Michael of Ephesus on Aristotle Nicomachean Ethics 8 and 9 (London: Duckworth 2001), Pity Transformed (London: Duckworth, 2001), and Envy, Spite and Jealousy: The Rivalrous Emotions in Ancient Greece, a collective volume edited with Keith Rutter (Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 2003).

[2] Emotion, Restraint, and Community in Ancient Rome (New York: Oxford University Press, 2005). Among other book-length studies of the emotions in Classics during the last thirty years, pride of place goes to William Fortenbaugh, Aristotle on Emotion: A Contribution to Philosophical Psychology, Rhetoric, Poetics, Politics, and Ethics (orig. 1975; 2nd ed. London: Duckworth, 2003), followed by a virtual flood that began in 1993: Douglas Cairns, AIDÔS: The Psychology and Ethics of Honour and Shame in Ancient Greek Literature (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1993); Carlin Barton, The Sorrows of the Ancient Romans (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1993); Martha Nussbaum, The Therapy of Desire: Theory and Practice in Hellenistic Ethics (Princeton: Princeton University Press. 1994); John Cooper, Reason and Emotion: Essays on Ancient Moral Psychology and Ethical Theory (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1999); Richard Sorabji, Emotion and Peace of Mind: From Stoic Agitation to Christian Temptation (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000); Carlin Barton, Roman Honor: The Fire in the Bones (Berkeley: University of California Press, 2001); William V.Harris, Restraining Rage: The Ideology of Anger Control in Classical Antiquity (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2001); Margaret Graver, Cicero on the Emotions: "Tusculan Disputations" 3 and 4 (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2002); and Peter Toohey, Melancholy, Love, and Time: Boundaries of the Self in Ancient Literature (Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press, 2004); as well as the collective volumes edited by Susanna Braund, and Christopher Gill, The Passions in Roman Thought and Literature (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997); Juha Sihvola, and Troels Engberg-Pedersen, The Emotions in Hellenistic Philosophy (Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1998); and Susanna Braund, and Glenn Most, Ancient Anger: Perspectives from Homer to Galen (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003).

[3] Thus, 'anger' (orgê) = Rhetoric 2.2 = Konstan chap. 2; 'satisfaction' (thus the understanding of praotês rightly favored by Konstan, against the more usual 'mildness') = 2.3 = chap. 3; 'friendship' (philia) / 'loving' (to philein) and 'enmity' (ekhthra) / 'hating' (to misein) = 2.4 = chap. 8-9; 'fear' (phobos) = 2.5 = chap. 6; 'shame (aiskhunê) or the contrary' (though Aristotle does not properly discuss the contrary, which should be something on the order of 'pride') = 2.6 = chap. 4; 'gratitude' (thus the understanding of kharis rightly favored, again, by Konstan, against the more usual 'kindliness' or 'benevolence') = 2.7 = chap. 7; 'pity' (eleos) = 2.8 = chap. 10; 'being indignant' (to nemesan) and 'envy' (phthonos) = 2.9-10 = chap. 5. Konstan leaves aside 'emulation' (zêlos), the 'good' counterpart of 'envy', discussed at Rhet. 2.11.

[4] As Konstan points out (324 n. 1), the understanding of kharis as 'gratitude' was worked out independently and more or less simultaneously by Christof Rapp, in his translation of the Rhetoric (Berlin: Akademie Verlag, 2002)

[5] The Greek term rendered as 'slight', oligôria, more precisely corresponds to 'treating as of little account'. Those not fit to slight you are your peers and inferiors; if you are the inferior in the transaction, 'it is no insult to be reminded of it' (55).

[6] Another part of the reason that Aristotle's 'anger' is focused on a personal slight, and not on 'injustice' more generally (a frequent spur to anger in the Attic orators who were Aristotle's contemporaries, 68), is that 'injustice' is the object of another of the emotions that Aristotle addresses, 'being indignant' (111ff.).

[7] A cavil here: though Konstan commonly says that 'satisfaction' (praotês) is prompted by seeing your social standing (doxa) 'elevated' or 'enhanced' (pp. 84, 85, 87, 89), it would probably be more apt to say that you are 'satisfied' when your standing is 'affirmed' (thus p. 89) or 'acknowledged'; for that both better suits the evidence cited and is what we should expect in the emotion that is the opposite of 'anger' (orgê), a response to a 'slight' that does not 'diminish' your status (pace p. 85) but actually denies it.

[8] The distinction between 'appears' (i.e., phainetai) and 'impression' (i.e., phantasia) is intended to replicate the distinction that Aristotle draws between that which is present and so in principle visible (thus the 'apparent slight' that prompts anger) and that which is prospective and so visible only in the imagination.

[9] 'Commonly but not exclusively' because zêlotupia was also used to name other emotions relevant to the general phenomenon of 'rivalrousness' (Latin invidia behaves much the same way). Thus (for example) neither of the two Stoic definitions quoted on p. 223 -- 'pain at another's having what one also has oneself' and 'pain at another getting what one wanted' -- is congruent with 'jealousy'; but then neither are they congruent with each other.

[10] On Konstan's reading, '[c]learly, Alcibiades wants Socrates entirely for himself; but the charge is not that Alcibiades fears rejection, as jealousy in the modern sense might suggest, but rather that he is unwilling to share Socrates' company with others' (228).

[11] I note in passing that though in Odes 1.13 Horace uses the literary tradition (as Konstan adroitly shows) to construct a persona who looks very much like a 'jealous lover', not a word in the text states or implies that the woman in question, Lydia, feels affection for him, or anything else.