The Epistemic Role of Consciousness

The Epistemic Role Of Consciousness Book Cover

Declan Smithies, The Epistemic Role of Consciousness, Oxford University Press, 2019, 442pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199917662.

Reviewed by Robert J. Howell, Southern Methodist University


Declan Smithies' book is an extraordinarily strong contribution to debates in philosophy of mind and epistemology. It is ambitious and expansive in scope while being extremely rigorously argued. It will be required reading for epistemologists, as well as for philosophers of mind interested in the value of consciousness for our lives as thinkers and knowers. It is, however, a rather long and dense book which can be challenging despite being well-written. Nevertheless, it handily repays the attention and close study it requires.

The book covers a good deal of terrain, but its main argument is that phenomenal consciousness is important because of the ineliminable role it plays in epistemic justification. One way of putting the thesis is to ask what exactly (philosophical) zombies lack that we have. Some philosophers argue that zombies cannot represent or think about the world because they lack consciousness. Smithies, on the other hand, argues that "zombies cannot know anything about the world, since they have no epistemic justification to form beliefs: on this view, phenomenal consciousness is the basis of all epistemic justification." (15) This is a surprisingly strong view on its face, and one that is not often defended in philosophy of mind, but it coheres well with an internalist picture of epistemic justification. Seen as such, it is perhaps a bit less radical than it first seems. Still, given this, it is a relatively short step to the conclusion that not only does phenomenal consciousness play a foundational role in epistemic justification, it is a sine qua non for the justification of action.

Of course, we can explain why your zombie twin behaves as it does by citing its unconscious representational and motivational states. . . . What we cannot do is explain the zombie's behavior in a way that shows it to be rational in light of the zombie's own reason for belief or action. (21)

While zombies' behaviors and beliefs can be explained from the outside -- after all, they speak and behave just like us -- the lights are off inside and as such there is really no acting or believing by their own lights.

The book is divided into two parts: Part I is Philosophy of Mind and Part II is Epistemology. In my view this division is a little misleading since much of Part I has to do with defending a phenomenal form of evidentialism and explains the epistemic role of consciousness in perception, introspection, and cognition. As such, it is largely a discussion of epistemology. (For example, in the discussion of introspection, the focus is less on the mechanisms of introspection and attention -- which might be more typical fare in philosophy of mind -- but instead defends a 'simple theory' of introspective justification.) Part II is dedicated to the defense of epistemic principles, epistemic rationality and the debates between externalism and internalism in epistemology. A better description of the two parts of the book (which Smithies also gives) is that the first part focuses upon an argument for his epistemic thesis "from below," considering the role consciousness plays in various faculties -- motivated largely by examples and intuitions about justification in those cases -- while the second part argues "from above," vindicating the intuitions in Part I using a more general theory of epistemic justification. But however one sees the divisions, each part supplements the other in important ways and either section on its own would leave out an important part of Smithies' argument.

While the book covers more topics that I can do justice to in this review, I will briefly run through the chapters indicating what they argue. I will then raise an area where I was left unconvinced.

After an introductory chapter clarifying the aims of the book and making clear the notion of consciousness he is working with, Chapter Two asks about the role of consciousness in representation. After criticizing the (currently popular) thesis that all representation is grounded in consciousness, he argues for the claim that conceptual representation (representation that can serve to justify beliefs) is grounded in consciousness. "It is only because perceptual experience has the phenomenal character of seeming to present me with objects and properties in the external world that it noninferentially justifies me in forming beliefs about those objects and properties." (71) Combining this idea with epistemic constraints on concepts explains the role of consciousness in conceptual thought. This account is extended in Chapter Three on perception, where it is argued that perceptual experience comes with "presentational force," which "is the kind of phenomenal character you have when it seems to you that you're presented with the very things that makes your experience true." (93) He then argues that phenomenal internalism -- the view that "perceptual experience justifies belief solely in terms of its phenomenal character" (97) -- provides the best account of what we should say in skeptical scenarios. Chapter Four argues that only states that are accessible to consciousness can be subject to epistemic norms and so play a role in justifying beliefs. This is in contrast to views according to which inferential integration is sufficient for a state to justify a belief. Chapter Five argues for the 'simple theory of introspection' according to which simply being in a conscious mental state provides (propositional) justification for believing one is in that mental state. It is argued that epistemic rationality requires that one's beliefs cohere with one's conscious mental states, and so an ideally rational agent will therefore not form false beliefs about those states. Chapter Six defends a form of evidentialism Smithies calls 'phenomenal mentalism,' which holds that one's phenomenally individuated mental states (which includes beliefs that are individuated by their disposition to give rise to judgments with a particular phenomenal character) ground all propositional justification.

The second part of the book begins with a defense of accessibilism in Chapter Seven. This centers around defending the JJ principle which holds that "Necessarily, you have justification to believe that p if and only if you have justification to believe that you have justification to believe that p." (229) This is defended by appeal to clairvoyance cases and the new evil demon problem. Smithies argues that the best explanation of accessibilism is phenomenal mentalism -- thus beginning his "argument from above." Chapter Eight, Reflection, continues a defense of the JJ principle by drawing from the relation between epistemic justification and reflection. In particular, Smithies argues that "justification is the epistemic property that makes our beliefs stable under reflection." (255) He defends the central role of reflection against numerous critiques by Hilary Kornblith. Chapter Nine furthers his argument for accessibilism by arguing that epistemic akrasia is always irrational. That is, it is never rational to be in a position to believe that p while believing one lacks justification for believing that p (as well as other similar mismatches between meta-justificational beliefs and first-order beliefs.) Chapter Ten continues the discussion about epistemic akrasia by addressing puzzles involving higher-order beliefs about what one's evidence supports. Smithies defends what he calls the "upward push" solution to these puzzles, according to which you "cannot have misleading higher-order evidence about what your first-order evidence supports." (316) Given the strong commitment to the JJ principle as well as to the simple theory of introspection, it is appropriate that Chapter Eleven considers anti-luminosity arguments by Williams, and the speckled-hen argument by Sosa. Long story short, Smithies claims that these arguments work against doxastic justification, which might not be luminous for imperfect agents like ourselves, and propositional justification. Luminosity holds for the latter. Finally, in Chapter 12 Smithies compares his view to Huemer's phenomenal conservatism and makes a strong case that Huemer's view has shortcomings that his view does not. (Of all the chapters in an already long book, Chapter 12 seems like the least needed. It would have been helpful to have a concluding retrospective chapter instead, in my opinion.)

It is difficult to offer any pithy book-review-packaged criticisms of Smithies' arguments because he does an excellent job of anticipating criticisms and replying to them at length. Frequently, as soon as one thinks of a shortcoming or a flaw in an argument, Smithies sees it himself and replies. With this in mind, I'll nevertheless push what I feel is a potential shortcoming in the book's argument: it underestimates zombies.

Recall that philosophical zombies are not only behavioral duplicates of ourselves, but they are also functional and physical duplicates. That means that they are very much unlike super-blindsighters (who form beliefs about the blind field without prompting or inference) or even super-duper blindsighters (who form higher-order beliefs about their first-order sources). These zombies not only say that things seem a certain way to them, but they do so based on informational states that represent things as being a certain way to them. In an important sense they are not blind at all. Granted, they are not phenomenally conscious, but they have states that play the same role that phenomenal consciousness does in us. I admit to sharing the intuition that without phenomenal consciousness I would be flying epistemically blind, but I also think that we have to doubt that intuition since phenomenal consciousness plays a certain functional role in us. When we subtract phenomenal consciousness from our picture of a creature, we tend, I think, to subtract that functional role as well and imagine a creature that is much more impoverished than zombies.

For example, part of the reason that phenomenal consciousness is so important in perception, according to Smithies, is that it has a "presentational force." Presentational force "is the kind of phenomenal character that your experience has when you perceive things, and when you hallucinate them, but not when you merely visualize or make judgments about things." (94) Smithies cashes this out in terms of phenomenal character, but clearly there is something like phenomenal force for zombies because there will be a difference in their representational systems that allows perception to play a different functional role than imagination. The question is, why can't this play the justificatory role of phenomenal force for zombies? Smithies has answers to this, but at least some of these answers act as though the only story for zombie justification will be reliabilism which faces clairvoyance counterexamples, etc. But there needn't be anything reliabilist about zombie justification if there is a functional equivalent of presentational force. States with zombie presentational force could play the same defeasible non-inferential justificatory role that states with phenomenal presentational force play. If that's the case, there will be analogous accessibility principles for zombies, ideal zombies will not face epistemic akrasia, and in general the whole internalist story -- the outlining of which takes up most of the book -- can be told about zombies.

Even if this criticism is right, and Smithies has plenty to say about such criticisms, this doesn't mean that Smithies is not right about the role of phenomenal consciousness in us. Perhaps there is an internalist epistemology for zombies, but Smithies makes an excellent case that such an epistemology is not our epistemology. For creatures like us, with phenomenal states that play the roles they do, Smithies makes a good case that phenomenal consciousness plays a foundational role in epistemic justification.