The Epistemology of Groups

The Epistemology Of Groups

Jennifer Lackey, The Epistemology of Groups, Oxford University Press, 2021, 200pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9780199656608.

Reviewed by Jeff Dunn, DePauw University


“Philip Morris International lied about the safety of cigarettes.” If a claim like that is true, Jennifer Lackey argues, then we have to countenance groups that have beliefs. For to lie requires at least that one state that p while believing that p is false. From this starting point, Lackey begins her book on the epistemology of groups. She goes on to defend a particular account of group belief (Chapter 1), an account of justified group belief (Chapter 2), an account of group assertion (Chapter 4), and an account of group lies (Chapter 5). She also considers and rejects (Chapter 3) several extant views of group knowledge that conflict with her account of justified group belief. Throughout, Lackey’s goal “is to make progress in understanding these crucial notions in collective epistemology . . . so as to shed light on whether it is groups, their individual members, or both who ought to be held responsible for collective actions” (3).

Lackey frames these issues as a dispute between inflationary non-summative views and deflationary summative views. Deflationary summative views, according to Lackey, hold that group phenomena such as group beliefs can be understood entirely in terms of summing up the states of individual group members. An example: a group is justified in believing p just in case most of its members are justified in believing p. Inflationary non-summative views, in contrast, “hold that group phenomena are over and above, or otherwise distinct from, individual members and their states” (3). An example of such a view is what Lackey calls the Joint Acceptance Account (JAA) of group belief: a group believes that p just in case the group members agree to jointly accept p. The distinction between inflationary non-summative and deflationary summative views is not altogether precise. After all, the JAA does make group belief depend on the individual group members and their states in one way: their individual states of jointly accepting p. The distinction is also not meant to be exhaustive since Lackey often locates her view as being neither deflationary nor inflationary and neither summative nor non-summative.

Though it would be nice if such central distinctions were a bit more precise, what is distinctive and valuable about Lackey’s contribution to collective epistemology is the way she shows how to thread between these two different extremes. A consistent argumentative theme throughout the book is that to understand group belief, justification, and knowledge, we need to look not just at what the group members believe, have justification for, or know, and simply add it all up. But similarly, we shouldn’t countenance group belief, justification, or knowledge that floats free of the individual members’ beliefs, justification, or knowledge. On Lackey’s view, we need to think about the members’ beliefs, but also at the bases for these beliefs, the members’ private evidence, and how all of these factors interacted with one another. Only then do we get defensible views of group belief, justification, and knowledge. For example, her account of group belief is as follows:

Group Agent Account: A group, G, believes that p iff: (1) there is a significant percentage of G’s operative members who believe that p, and (2) are such that adding together the bases of their beliefs that p yields a belief set that is not substantively incoherent. (48–9)

Clause (1) here is something more on the deflationary/summative end of things. Clause (2), on the other hand, is directed at the group level and so more on the inflationary/non-summative side. Her account of justified group belief, which I won’t reproduce here, sits similarly between these two extremes. It is worth noting that Lackey’s account of group assertion and her account of group lies do not fit this mold and are unabashedly inflationary in the sense that groups can assert things that no member asserts and lie when no member lies. There is a principled reason for this, according to Lackey, which is that one can grant authority to another to speak on one’s behalf (and so also lie on one’s behalf) whereas one cannot grant authority to another to believe or know on one’s behalf.

Overall Lackey’s work is rich and rewarding. She offers clear, creative arguments and sketches a view that fits coherently together. It is essential reading for anyone who wants to engage with collective epistemology, and also the related topics of group responsibility, group action, and group liability.

Readers should know, however, that the vast majority of this book is word-for-word identical to papers Lackey has previously published. This is not acknowledged in the text nor in any other part of the book so is likely to go unnoticed by many.[1] This leads to some unfortunate omissions, an occasional muddying of the scholarly record, and a few misleading footnotes. As for unfortunate omissions, there is little engagement with the objections and responses that have emerged since Lackey initially published these papers. As for muddying the scholarly record, an example of this is at the beginning of Chapter 4. Lackey writes: “How should we understand a spokesperson’s having the requisite authority to speak on a group’s behalf? This question has been largely absent from work on collective phenomena, but a notable exception is found in Kirk Ludwig’s (2014)” (140). While that statement might have been true when it was initially written in 2018, there has been more scholarship on this since, not least of which is Lackey’s own 2018 paper (which just is Chapter 4 of the book). And as for misleading footnotes, there are multiple examples like the following: “I develop this line of argument in far more detail, and in response to a broader range of theories than just the Condorcet-inspired one discussed here, in Lackey (2014b) and in Chapter 3 of this book” (94). The reader is given no indication that Lackey (2014b) just is, for all intents and purposes, Chapter 3 of this book. None of this, of course, speaks to the quality of the philosophical work, which is consistently high. And some may find it nice to have Lackey’s previous work on collective epistemology collected in one place. But a note that this book consists largely of previous work would have been useful for the reader.

In what remains of this review, I’ll put this issue to the side and focus specifically on a few arguments Lackey makes about group belief.

Early in the book, Lackey argues against two accounts of group belief that are inflationary and non-summative. The first is the JAA already introduced above. Lackey’s objection to the JAA is compelling and effective: it cannot account for group lies and group bullshit. Focus on group lies. To lie you must assert something while believing it not to be true. And clearly Philip Morris is lying when it asserts that cigarettes are safe. But if the board decides to jointly accept that smoking is safe, and if that is all it takes for them to believe that cigarettes  are safe (as the JAA holds), then they are not lying. Lackey’s diagnosis of the problem here seems spot on: the JAA makes group belief too voluntary, which makes it too easy to escape the charge of lying.

Lackey uses the same argument against a different account of group belief, the Premise-Based Aggregation Account (PBAA), which is an account of group belief based on a specific judgment aggregation rule. According to the PBAA, a group believes p just in case a specified percentage of operative members of the group believe p where p is a “premise” or p follows from other beliefs the group has (even if a majority does not believe it). It is easiest to understand this view in action. Suppose three workers are trying to determine whether they should take a pay sacrifice to install additional safety measures. They will take a pay sacrifice iff a) there is currently serious danger, b) the safety measures will be effective, and c) the sacrifice is bearable. According to the PBAA, the group’s beliefs are determined by voting on the premises (a, b, and c) and then using these votes to determine whether the group believes that a pay sacrifice is warranted. On such a view, the group can believe things that no individual member does (this is an instance of the discursive dilemma[2]), and so Lackey counts the PBAA as an inflationary, non-summative view.

She goes on to argue that the group lies objection works against the PBAA and suggests that the objection therefore suggests that all inflationary non-summative accounts of group belief are mistaken. But this is questionable. To see that the argument does not simply generalize, note that just because a view is inflationary and non-summative, it does not follow that group belief is under the voluntary control of the group members. And so it does not follow that a group can voluntarily choose their beliefs to avoid the charge of lying. We can see this in the specific case of the PBAA. Lackey claims that group belief is voluntary for the PBAA because a group could change its judgment aggregation rule until it gets one that delivers the belief that the group wants. But it is no part of the PBAA that groups can change their aggregation rule as they wish. Suppose, for concreteness, that a group decides on a supermajority premise-based judgment aggregation rule because they are keenly interested in coming to reliable group decisions and sincerely believe this to be the best means to that end. Perhaps it is written in the group’s charter that they are required to stick with such a rule. This is clearly an inflationary, non-summative view since such a group can have beliefs that no member holds. But, such a group will not get cases of group lies wrong in the way that Lackey argues because this group cannot voluntarily engineer their group beliefs. The aggregation rule is fixed and the inputs to this aggregation rule are the actual beliefs of the operative members. Group lies, then, are not cases that show a problem with inflationary, non-summative views in general, or the PBAA in specific.

Though the case of group lies is Lackey’s main argument against inflationary, non-summative views of group belief, at the end of Chapter 1 she introduces two new arguments not previously published. The arguments concern what she calls ‘judgment fragility’ and ‘base fragility’. I will focus on only the latter here. A group belief state has base fragility when the bases of a significant subset of its members’ beliefs conflict with the bases of another significant subset of its members’ beliefs. Suppose that a department is unanimous in thinking that candidate C is the best hire. Half of the department believes this because they are interested in the department thriving and think C is the best at research and teaching, and the other half of the department believes this because they have a sinister desire to destroy the department and they think C is the worst at research and teaching. In this case, the group belief that C is the best hire (if it is a group belief) exhibits base fragility. Both the JAA and the PBAA permit group beliefs with base fragility. But Lackey thinks this is an unacceptable consequence. Why? Two reasons are given. First, group beliefs should be subject to epistemic evaluation, but beliefs that exhibit base fragility are not always evaluable. Suppose the department gets information strongly supporting the claim that candidate C is a very good researcher and teacher. Does this support or defeat the group belief that C is the best candidate? It is unclear. Second, group beliefs must be able to figure into collective deliberation about future actions of the group. But a group belief that is base fragile will not do this, since the reasons in favor of the group belief are different and so call for different plans.

This is an interesting new kind of objection to certain accounts of group belief. In response, I will suggest that this objection, if sound, seems to undermine Lackey’s own view of group belief, too. Suppose there is a group of national security advisers who are deciding whether a foreign country is at significant risk of devolving into chaos. All of the advisers think that there is no significant risk. One subset of advisers thinks that economic conditions are the primary predictor of such things. Because the economic indicators are good, they surmise that the risk is low. Another subset of advisers thinks that political conditions are the primary predictor of such things. Because the political indicators are good, they surmise that the risk is low, too. Here, the advisers believe what they believe for different reasons, or at least with different emphases. The economics-minded advisers also consider the political situation but weigh it significantly less heavily and vice versa for the politics-minded advisers. The bases of their beliefs, though not identical, are not substantively incoherent. Lackey notes that groups can have different, mutually supporting bases for the same belief and that this alone does not render them incoherent. The case just described seems to be such a case. There is nothing incoherent with political and economic indicators pointing in the same direction. So, according to Lackey’s account of group belief (GAA), the group of advisers believes that the country is not at risk. Nevertheless, the group seems to be open to the very worries that Lackey has about groups with base fragility. Consider epistemic evaluation: if evidence comes in that the economic situation has soured but the political one remains stable, is this a defeater for the group belief or not? Similarly, the group belief may have trouble fitting into group deliberation. The reasons for thinking that the risk is low are different for different advisers and so call for different contingency plans. Perhaps Lackey’s response is that in such a case the group does not in fact have a belief. But if so, I think hers is a view that will rule out group belief in all but the few cases where the group members walk in lockstep, holding the same beliefs for the same reasons. If base fragility is a genuine concern for group belief, then perhaps there aren’t so many group beliefs after all.


Lackey, J. (2013). ‘Lies and Deception: An Unhappy Divorce’. Analysis, 73(2): 236–248.

Lackey, J. (2014), ‘Socially Extended Knowledge’. Philosophical Issues, 24: 282–298.

Lackey, J. (2016) ‘What Is Justified Group Belief?’. The Philosophical Review, 125(3): 341–396.

Lackey, J. (2018) ‘Group Assertion’. Erkenntnis, 83: 21–42.

Lackey, J. (2018). ‘Group Lies’. Lying: Language, Knowledge, Ethics, and Politics, Eliot Michaelson and Andreas Stokke (eds.). Oxford University Press. 262–284.

Lackey, J. (2020) ‘Group Belief: Lessons from Lies and Bullshit’. Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 94(1): 185–208.

Pettit, P. and Rabinowicz, W. (2001), ‘Deliberative Democracy and the Discursive Dilemma”. Philosophical Issues, 11: 268–299.


[1] For those interested in more detail, Chapter 1 (except for sections 1.3–1.5) is identical to Lackey’s 2020 paper “Group Belief: Lessons from Lies and Bullshit”. Chapter 2 is identical to her 2016 paper “What is Justified Group Belief?”. Chapter 3 (except for section 3.5) is identical to her 2014 paper “Socially Extended Knowledge”. Chapter 4 is identical to her 2018 paper “Group Assertion”. And Chapter 5 consists of Lackey’s 2013 paper “Lies and Deception” inserted into the middle of her 2018 paper “Group Lies”. Sections 1.3–1.5 (13 pages) contain two new arguments against certain accounts of group belief and Lackey’s own new account of what it is for a group to believe. Section 3.5 (9 pages) is a new discussion of the legal doctrine of collective knowledge. The Introduction also consists of new material.

[2] See Pettit and Rabinowicz (2001).