The Equal Society: Essays in Theory and Practice

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George Hull (ed.), The Equal Society: Essays in Theory and Practice, Rowman and Littlefield, 2015, 354pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498515719.

Reviewed by Valentin Beck, Freie Universität Berlin


What would be the central characteristics of a society in which its citizens are truly treated as equals? While egalitarian thinkers are united in their affirmation of the value of equality, they notoriously have -- for centuries -- disagreed about its interpretation. Egalitarianism now is a dominant current within Western moral and political philosophy, but it is also very broad and multifaceted. There is a wide range of mutually inconsistent egalitarian conceptions, ranging from libertarian and meritocratic positions to social liberal, communitarian and socialist ones. Therefore, the decisive question is not whether one should be an egalitarian, but what kind of egalitarian one should be, and how to interpret the central tenet of equal treatment more concretely in political theory and practice.

The anthology under review sheds light on this question. It offers a fascinatingly rich collection of original essays from a diverse group of scholars, some of whom have been shaping egalitarian discourse for decades. An introduction by George Hull and a helpful index complete a collection that will surely be indispensable for those wishing to take stock of recent developments in egalitarian thought. The book's more theoretical first part is dedicated to expansions and revisions of the concept of equality. It focuses on theoretical innovations concerning, among other topics, the interpretation of "social" or "relational" equality, and methodological issues such as the relation of non-ideal to ideal theory. The second part contains contributions on more applied issues, namely equality in higher education (Ann E. Cudd), the challenges to equality posed by the gendered division of labour (Gina Schouten), workplace democracy (Pierre-Yves Néron), modern constitutionalism (David Bilchitz) and historical redress claims (Daryl Glaser). The division of the book into two parts should not be misinterpreted, however. All of the contributions in one way or the other address the theoretical challenge of fleshing out the tenet of equal treatment. And while the articles in the second part have a more specific focus, those in the first also contain more concrete references to what the tenet of equal treatment implies in practice.

The volume does not take stock of the entire range of egalitarian theories, but rather assembles a variety of innovative positions and perspectives. At least six such areas receive in-depth treatment in the volume: first, the idea of "social" or "relational equality", as opposed to "distributional equality" (Jonathan Wolff, Miranda Fricker, Tom P. S. Angier, Lucy Allais, Néron and Daniel Putnam); second, the focus on race as a neglected category in egalitarian thinking (Charles W. Mills and Glaser); third, reflection on capabilities as metric of justice and wellbeing (Fricker, Bekka Williams and Hull); fourth, the importance of rectificatory justice for establishing more equal societies (Mills and Glaser); fifth, African-communitarianism as a distinct egalitarian current (Thaddeus Metz); and sixth, a negativist methodology, according to which specific inequalities or injustices should be the starting point of egalitarian theorizing, rather than the affirmation of an abstract ideal (particularly Wolff, Mills and Fricker). The treatment of this array of topics is generally very stimulating and deserves to be studied in detail. Without wishing to neglect any of these areas or essays in particular, I will limit my more extensive comments to the essays of Mills, Fricker and Wolff, in which several of the above-mentioned innovative concepts are concerned. At the end of this review, I will briefly reflect on why the present volume, which is up-to-date on an impressive number of issues, excludes any treatment of international and global economic inequalities as well as intergenerational environmental inequalities.

In "Racial Equality" Mills addresses race as a neglected category as well as the issues of methodological negativism (see Hull's introduction, p. 3, for this term) and corrective justice, which are interlinked. Mills has gained prominence by arguing that contemporary political philosophy, and particularly its contractualist strand, does not adequately address racial inequalities in liberal societies. In this essay, he argues that race is an essential category and shows the extent to which it has been neglected in what he calls "mainstream social justice theory, particularly Rawlsianism" (p. 44). Beyond this deconstructive concern, however, Mills also demonstrates how egalitarian theorizing can better incorporate issues of racial inequalities. He points to different positions on the metaphysics of race, ranging from simple eliminativism, according to which race does not exist in any sense, to variants of anti-eliminativism, including the constructivist variant to which Mills himself subscribes. Anti-eliminativist constructivism holds that races do not exist biologically, but as "socio-political constructs brought into existence through discriminatory socio-political processes" (p. 44).

From this angle, Mills analyses different forms of racism in "racist societies", which are distinguished from "overtly racist regimes" such as the U.S. under Jim Crow, Nazi Germany or South Africa under apartheid, because they lack features such as an "overtly racist ideology" or de jure discriminations (see p. 49). What matters is that racist societies still structurally advantage whites to a very significant extent, even in the absence of formal discrimination. Mills sets aside racism of the interpersonal kind, embodied in individual actions, since it is deemed "not relevant for racial inequality as a broad social phenomenon" (p. 45). Alternatively, one might argue that individual racist behaviour is relevant and could be integrated into the structural analysis that Mills is championing, since structural injustices likely influence the forms that interpersonal racism takes. Be that as it may, Mills focuses on "socio-institutional" racism (see p. 45) as the more fundamental phenomenon and which can exist even in the absence of interpersonal racism. He holds that racially unequal societies possess a "racialized basic structure" (p. 54), which discriminates against black people even while they possess formal equality with white people. These distinctions allow for the observation that ideal theory of the Rawlsian kind, which justifies principles for societies that are at least approximately just, cannot address racial discriminations of the kind that are typical for Western societies, since they simply do not exist in this framework.

This is where methodological negativism comes into play. Mills states that, instead of focusing on scenarios of roughly full compliance, theorists should start by designing principles of non-ideal theory with the aim of establishing transitional justice. This will lead to substantially different principles and priority rules, compared for example to the well-known principles that are discussed by Rawls under the notion of justice as fairness. Ideal theory does not become altogether obsolete in this variant of methodological negativism, however. Its proper function is to illustrate the ideal of a just society, which could one day be realized if principles of non-ideal theory are implemented. So despite his harsh criticism of Rawlsian ideal theory, Mills acknowledges a need for ideal theory next to non-ideal theorizing. Within his framework of "modified Rawlsianism" (p. 66), his use of the distinction between ideal and non-ideal theory is also broadly in line with Rawls' usage.

Fricker, too, is renowned for addressing a category that has hitherto been neglected in egalitarian thought, namely that of epistemic injustice (2007). In "Epistemic Contribution as a Central Human Capability", Fricker builds on central themes of her groundbreaking monograph. Her goal is to show that any society dedicated to furthering human well-being has to take seriously the ways in which it enables or constrains the capacities of its members to contribute to commonly shared knowledge. In order to enhance the well-being of their members, societies must realize their capability of epistemic contribution, understood as a "combined capability" in the sense coined by Martha Nussbaum (that is, as both an internally developed and an externally enabled capability). Fricker affirms and significantly extends the capabilities metric developed by Sen and Nussbaum. Her work is more closely aligned with Nussbaum than with Sen, since she emphasizes her sympathies for the project of formulating a "list of capabilities that might at least roughly capture workable universal characterisation of human well-being" (p. 77). However, Nussbaum's list is incomplete according to Fricker, because it displays a bias towards capabilities of practical as opposed to theoretical reason (see p. 75). In going back to Wolff and Avner de-Shalit (2007, p. 45), Fricker defends a "two-directional conception of human well-being" (p. 76), reminding us that "while it is good to receive it is also good to give" (p. 75). Fricker posits that the capability of epistemic contribution consists in being able to "contribute to the pool of shared epistemic materials -- materials for knowledge, understanding, and very often for practical deliberation" (p. 76).

It is not Fricker's aim to show that we can sometimes be morally obliged not to withhold knowledge from others, which would be a relatively easy and straightforward task depending on the concrete type and context of concealment in question. She instead aims to show that it is good and even essential for their wellbeing for individuals to contribute knowledge to society. Individuals' capabilities of epistemic contribution can be constrained or enabled by certain types of interpersonal behaviour as well as by societal structures. To justify why the protection of this capability of theoretical reason is important, Fricker draws on the value of non-domination in the sense of liberty from arbitrary interference made famous by Philip Pettit. Pettit argues that freedom from arbitrary interference can only be secured through public institutions which allow members of society to publicly contest such interferences. For such contestation, however, the capability of epistemic contribution must in turn be realized (see p. 86).

Beyond introducing a concept that deserves the concern of egalitarians in theory and practice, Fricker sheds light on a number of other hotly debated issues, such as the critique of recipient-oriented approaches to equality and the conceptualization of relational equality. Fricker also has interesting things to say on what she calls a "failure-first methodology" (p. 74), which informs her account of epistemic injustice and her concept of epistemic contribution. Her methodology is similar to Mills', in that it places an emphasis on starting with the negative. But it diverges at least in one respect: for Fricker, starting with the negative is not necessarily tied to non-ideal theorizing, since the concepts of "justice" and "equality" need to be comprehensively interpreted by taking into account the "endemic pressures for collapse into injustice and inequality" (p. 73). Fricker therefore emphasizes that a failure-first-methodology is conceptually distinct from the dichotomy of ideal and non-ideal theorizing and can yield fruitful results within either framework.

In "Social Equality, Relative Poverty and Marginalised Groups", Wolff answers these methodological questions differently. Wolff's aim is to analyze how absolute and relative poverty prevent the achievement of a (truly) equal society, which he defines as one that is free from asymmetrical relations and from relations of estrangement and alienation. His methodology for this enterprise is set out at the start of the essay. Like Mills and Fricker, Wolff emphasizes the importance of "starting from problems with the actual world rather than a depiction of an ideal world" (p. 24). But unlike Mills and Fricker, who each acknowledge the significance of ideal theory when appropriately combined with non-ideal theory, Wolff completely rejects ideal theory. He holds that "an ideal theory of social equality is hard to sustain, because it is very difficult to give precise and unique content to an ideal of social equality" (p. 22). Instead, there are "many different ways in which a society could count as a 'society of equals' . . . . Quaker Society, a Kibbutz, and a 1960s Californian Hippy community may all, if things go well, count as small-scale societies of equals" (p. 23). In place of the term of non-ideal theory Wolff suggests that of "real-world political philosophy" (p. 22), because it avoids any connotation of dependence on ideal theorizing.

Looking at the work of Mills, Fricker, and Wolff, we can distinguish three variants of methodological negativism. Mills' variant is placed within the classical Rawlsian understanding of ideal and non-ideal theory, but displays a much greater emphasis on the latter as opposed to the former. Fricker's approach underlines the distinctness and complementarity of the negativist methodology by stating that it can be applied to either non-ideal or ideal theorizing. Wolff's methodological negativism transcends the classic distinction of ideal and non-ideal theory by rejecting the focus on ideals for political theory altogether. Mills' and Fricker's approaches to methodological negativism are in principle compatible, but Wolff's approach cannot be reconciled with them, due to his complete rejection of ideal theory.

Methodological concerns are not the only focus in Wolff's article. His two main themes are providing an account of different forms of poverty, and reflecting on how to tackle them from a perspective that values the idea of "social equality" (widely treated as synonymous with "relational equality"). This idea has gained steam in recent years since being affirmed in the writings of thinkers such as Elizabeth Anderson, Samuel Scheffler and Tim Scanlon, and it is also treated in a number of other contributions to the volume (compare the third paragraph above; see also Fourie/Schuppert/Wallimann-Helmer 2015). Wolff dedicates particular attention to the notion of relative poverty and how it is connected with that of social (in)equality. Poverty is dependent on what is customary in a given society, Adam Smith noted when he wrote that "in the present times, through the greater part of Europe, a creditable day-labourer would be ashamed to appear in public without a linen shirt" (Smith 1776, book 5, ch. 2). According to Wolff, "one is in relative poverty if one lacks the consumption and household goods customary in one's society, or lacks resources sufficient to allow a social life, or is unable to purchase what is needed to avoid shame" (p. 26). While this tripartite notion of relative poverty has material implications, it is preferable to purely monetary definitions (e.g. defining poverty as receiving an income below 60 percent of the median income). Numerical definitions of poverty scratch only at the surface of what it means to be poor, and fail to distinguish between material inequalities, as problematic as they may otherwise be, and poverty. Wolff's definition shows how relative poverty and social inequality are connected yet distinct phenomena. They are not identical because there can be other forms of inequality that are not reflected in a lack of resources to participate in customary social practices -- such as asymmetric race or gender relations. Wolff analyses different constellations of deprivation that result from the desire to "fit in", such as when people spend resources on status goods such as mobile phones despite lacking the resources for basic necessities (see p. 29). Fighting poverty effectively might also be complicated by the fact that "fitting in" to a local community might require different resources or efforts than fitting in to society more broadly.

Wolff's account of poverty is illuminating. It shows how relative poverty may be interpreted from a social egalitarian perspective, according to which equal distributions of specific goods are not of ultimate, but only derivative egalitarian concern. His essay should be of interest not only for normative and empirical theorists, but also for policy-makers and others who deal with the goal of poverty-alleviation in practice.

The articles by Mills, Fricker and Wolff are representative of a collection that embodies the state of the art of contemporary egalitarian theory in many respects. Two important subjects, however, are missing from the otherwise multifaceted picture. There is no engagement with economic inequalities beyond the nation state. Neither does this work treat intergenerational environmental inequalities resulting from environmental degradation and man-made climate change. These two concerns give egalitarians reason to question the fairness and legitimacy of the international order. To start with, the distribution of income and capital across nation states remains highly unequal, which increases incentives for those who find themselves in less fortunate circumstances to seek better living conditions abroad. Furthermore, while trade with resources, goods and services has never been more global and interdependent than today, it may be argued that the current system has primarily benefitted the world's wealthy and powerful, and that it rests on practices that are highly environmentally destructive and which violate the basic human rights of labourers and affected populations. Finally, past and present generations have contributed to environmental degradation and fossil fuel consumption to a much larger degree than future generations will, assuming they act in such a way as to avoid the most catastrophic outcomes.

What should we make of the absence of these topics in an anthology that seeks to shed light on contemporary egalitarian theorizing? An uncharitable reading may trace it back to an unexpressed particularism. It would be hard to argue that demands of equal treatment stop at national or communal borders or generational confines -- at least not in a highly interdependent world like ours. Neither could the widely shared social (or relational) egalitarian perspective plausibly attach any such categorical constraints to egalitarian demands. New technologies now allow an increasing number of the world's least well-off individuals to compare themselves to more privileged individuals across national boundaries, which in turn affects what they seek to achieve in life and what they will regard as justified or unjustified inequalities. A more charitable interpretation is that a single anthology simply cannot cover all of the issues that are currently at the forefront of egalitarian theory. However, it should be clear that while it remains important and rewarding to reflect on the conditions of "The Equal Society", an egalitarian should certainly not stop there. Instead, she should also ask what it would mean to transform transnational and transgenerational relations in a way so that all humans are (truly) treated as equals.


Carina Fourie, Fabian Schuppert, Ivo Wallimann-Helmer (eds.), Social Equality: On What It Means to Be Equals, Oxford University Press 2015.

Miranda Fricker, Epistemic Injustice: Power & the Ethics of Knowing, Oxford University Press 2007.

Adam Smith, An Inquiry into the Nature and Causes of the Wealth of Nations [1776], edited by R. H. Campbell and A. S. Skinner, Clarendon Press/Oxford University Press 1976.

Jonathan Wolff/Avner De-Shalit, Disadvantage, Oxford University Press 2007.