The Ethics and Politics of Immigration: Core Issues and Emerging Trends

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Alex Sager (ed.), The Ethics and Politics of Immigration: Core Issues and Emerging Trends, Rowman and Littlefield, 2016, 276pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781783486137.

Reviewed by Stefan Schlegel, Max Planck Institute for the Study of Religious and Ethnic Diversity


It is not an easy task to give focus to a book with the title "The Ethics and Politics of Immigration: Core Issues and Emerging Trends". Alex Sager does a great job of framing such a vast issue in the first and the last chapter. The setting in which he stages the book is one in which migration is still seen as something pathological, and nations not only as natural and given but also as largely benevolent institutions. As he notes in his introduction, "the history of humanity is a history of mobility, but political philosophy has often operated under the assumption of stasis in which migration is ignored or treated as pathological and exceptional". In the final chapter, he concludes with some amazement how cosmopolitan and nationalist authors in the field have converged towards a rather favorable depiction of the nation state as a source of solidarity, identity, and distributive justice.

It is one of the ironies of the book that several of its 13 chapters do not overcome or question these paradigms. The structure of the book itself -- four parts on "Admissions", "Enforcement and its Effects", "Integration and Inclusion", and "New Directions for the Philosophy of Immigration" -- reflects the idea that migration is something exceptional and temporal, a process that has to be brought to a swift end or has to be undone. The chapters themselves, in a book that covers such a vast topic, can only be spotlights. Besides contributions of a comparably broad scope like Amy Reed-Sandoval's on the open borders debate, there are fairly specific contributions like Valeria Ottonelli and Tiziana Torresi's excellent and helpful chapter on the role of consent in trafficking and smuggling or José Jorge Mendoza's interesting and counterintuitive chapter on the relation of the illegalization of immigrants and white supremacy.

As diverse as the chapters are, some cross-cutting issues link most of them. The first and most striking of these is the pathological-paradigm of migration mentioned above; others are the question of the exact nature of the good which immigration governance distributes and the relationship of political philosophy to neighboring disciplines like law and empirical social sciences.  I will focus on these issues in what follows.

There are obvious and less obvious ways of treating migration as a pathological phenomenon and the organization of human society in nation states as the natural and desirable state of things. Obvious ways are to borrow the language of 'intrusion', 'crisis', of 'guests' that have to be 'naturalized' if they stay and so on. The contributors avoid these. Less obvious ways are those that assume that the right to control migratory movements is naturally allocated to nation states and hence that it is migrants who impose social costs on receiving societies while ignoring the social costs that are imposed on potential migrants (and their communities of origin) by preventing them from migrating. One instance in which this occurs is Caleb Yong's chapter on family-based migration. Relying on Laura Ferracioli (whose position he is analyzing), he discusses the notion that immigrants impose social costs on the receiving countries that cannot be fully internalized (p. 66). But the social costs that states impose on potential and actual migrants whom they prevent from living together with their families and for whom there are no mechanisms available to internalize these costs remain unconsidered. This reflects the underlying assumption that the imposition of social costs by states on potential migrants is normal, natural and legitimate (it even becomes questionable whether we can meaningfully talk about social costs in that context), while the imposition of social costs by migrants on receiving states is an exceptional event that requires exceptional legitimation.

Another manifestation of the paradigm of migration as pathological is the brain-drain debate that suggests that development occurs only in the very region where migrants were born. In its subtext, this implies that geographical regions -- not people or households or communities -- are the ultimate subjects of development. It suggests that there is something natural about the tie of an individual to a geographical region. Patti Tamara Lenard's contribution regarding the rights of temporary migrants provides an example of this assumption. In her distinction between the distribution of wealth and the distribution of development, she insists that temporary labor migration might contribute only to the first, not to the latter. But this is only tenable if development is reduced to the development of democratic and resilient economic institutions in the region of origin of migrants (p. 99), which seems a reductionist concept of development if people (or households, or communities) are seen as the subject of development, rather than places. The warnings against the pitfalls of methodological nationalism, voiced by the editor of the volume (p. 229) are not taken into account in this analysis.

Notable exceptions to the tendency to treat migration as a freak event are the chapters by Parvati Raghuram on migration and feminist care ethics and by Iseult Honohan on civic integration. Raghuram shows how feminist care ethics implicitly or explicitly presupposes a given place where care is given and received, a perception that often is at odds with the real biography of migrant caregivers, which is marked by ongoing mobility. Honohan's contribution -- the one chapter that deals with the integration of migrants -- carefully points out how the risk of domination is inherent in requirements of civic integration, especially in tests that require fixed criteria of language skills or civic knowledge.

Another cross-cutting issue that comes up in several contributions goes to the question of the distributional effect of migration policies and the redistributional effect of changes in these policies. Closely related to this problem is the question of what sorts of goods are at stake -- what exactly is contained in the bundle of rights that migrants receive when they are granted access to migration -- especially if these goods are rival and excludable (like private goods) or just excludable (like club goods). The most fundamental encounter with this problem is in Reed-Sandoval's contribution on what she calls the classical and the new Open Borders Debates. In her account, the classical debate is determined by the conception of immigration policy as a field of politics that distributes the good of social membership (as introduced by Michael Walzer), a good that is "necessarily determined by the members of which these communities are comprised" (p. 15). It is interesting to see that Walzer's opponents in what is coined the classical debate (Joseph Carens and Chandran Kukathas) made little use of the language of 'goods' but instead emphasized 'rights' and 'privileges' (which of course have an impact on people's lives and therefore could be termed goods as well). In Reed-Sandoval's account of a new Open Borders Debate, feminist, anti-racist and anti-colonial perspectives play a more important role than a reconsideration of the goods at stake, and the puzzle -- introduced by the classical debate -- remains relevant, as several other chapters show.

In Michael Blake's defense of his theory of criteria for legitimate exclusion, the problem of the nature of the distributed goods is a central one. As the good "access to migration" is often compared with access to real estate (and irregular migration therefore with "trespassing"), here it is compared to the use of a coffee machine. The analogy was introduced by Douglas McKay, to whom Blake is responding. McKay insists that the exclusion from and the allocation of the good "access to migration" are distinct problems that require distinct solutions (p. 37). Blake argues against this with an analogy to criminal law: "The state must not only punish in accordance with guilt; it must also obtain the right to be the one doing the punishing. . . the legal system itself, in short, must be justified as a system with the right to exercise coercion . . ." (p. 40). This is why he rejects the idea that the question of distribution is distinct from the question of justification. Relative justification of the exclusion remains important, even if exclusion is justifiable in absolute terms. What remains unresolved in this exchange, however, is the nature of the good that is distributed and redistributed by migration policy. This, it seems, concerns both questions, the one regarding the justifiability of the exclusion from this good and the one regarding its subsequent allocation to those who remain exempt from the exclusion. Is a coffee machine (excludable but hardly rival) a suitable analogy? Or are there aspects regarding the rivalry and the excludability of the good "access to migration" that distinguish it fundamentally from club goods like coffee machines and private goods like the coffee they brew?

The question is relevant in a context in which access to migration -- be it only access to temporary labor migration opportunities (TLMP) as Lenard discusses them -- is viewed as "redistribution". Does redistribution really mean redistribution in this context? Does it mean to take something away from those who have and give (the same thing) to those who have not (as Lenard seems to suggest, p. 95)? Is it a zero-sum game (like with the coffee in the coffee machine, which can be consumed either by you or by me)? Or is it rather a reallocation by which the losers probably lose considerably less than the winners might win? Is it a reallocation that enlarges the pie overall? Is the possible development-effect to which Lenard refers a part of the redistribution or not? What about expected future income generated through the good of current market access? These questions can only be answered if we are clear about what good it is that is distributed and redistributed by migration governance.

What kind of good is it that irregular migrants receive by way of their regulation? This is a central question in Adam Hosein's contribution. Analogies with clubs of which irregular migrants aim to become members (p. 167) and of land on which they allegedly trespass (p. 176) are especially prevalent in this debate. The question whether such analogies are helpful always comes down to the question of the nature of the good that is allocated. If it is non-rival (because my use of an institutional setting of a country does not or hardly at all diminish its utility to others) then the notion of trespassing can be dismissed out of hand (like the analogy of the coffee in the coffee machine) because it wrongly evokes comparison to the private good of land. If the good is non-excludable (because the good can be enjoyed or partly enjoyed even by people irregularly present in a country) then the analogy of a club is misleading because it suggests that membership is the crucial thing about migration and not access to institutions like well-working political and legal systems and the labor markets that can flourish under this institutional roof.

The problem resurfaces in an entirely different context, namely that concerning the question of who should have access to protection as a refugee. An example is Matthew Lister's view that people, already protected by the Convention Against Torture (but not persecuted in the sense of the Refugee Convention) have no particular need to be included in the protection as refugees (p. 49). This argument puts aside the important status rights that come with the recognition as a refugee, which include much more than mere non-refoulement. The concept of a bundle of rights to which migrants have or do not have access (and that might or might not contain non-refoulement, access to markets, to social transfers, etc.) would be helpful to render such aspects visible.

The collection raises interesting questions on the relationship of political philosophy and neighboring disciplines such as law. The legally trained reader would wish that political philosophers working on migration would consult case law more often. This is so, first, for a better understanding of what are the most pressing problems for the practitioners of migration governance and where impulses from political philosophy would, therefore, be particularly welcome. Second, case law would offer a host of unlikely and complex individual situations, often too strange to be invented, that pose particularly challenging and interesting problems for political philosophers to reflect on. An example where the first form of cross-fertilization could have been useful is the chapter on migrant detention by Stephanie J. Silverman. She starts from the assumption that International Human Rights standards fail to adequately define detention, including when it is occurring and when it must end (pp. 107, 113). This seems, from a legal point of view, questionable. At least in the regional Human Rights regime of the Council of Europe, there is a binding jurisprudence that sets out in detail the definition of detention, its legal requirements, and the possibilities for legally challenging it. On the global level, the UN Human Rights Committee recently distilled its expanding case law on detention into its General Comment No. 35, which contains important general requirements regarding the detention of migrants and refugees.

An example where real-life problems could have been usefully fused into a philosophical analysis is the chapter on family migration by Yong that remains silent on the thorny question of reversed family reunification. These are situations in which the dependent family member holds a migration status or is a citizen of a receiving country to which the caring family member has to immigrate in order for the family to live together. These constellations not only pose challenging questions for jurisprudence but also for political philosophy, especially if the theory of family reunification is built around dependent-carer relationships as in Yong's contribution. One intriguing question would be whether the reversed family reunification can be grounded in the claims of the dependent (as it is grounded by Yong in the cases where the immigration of dependent family members is in question) and whether this still holds if the dependent citizen or resident would have the opportunity to join his or her carer where they reside. In real life, this question occurs regularly and has led to a detailed jurisprudence in many countries (the important Zambrano-Case of the ECJ even led to the notion of "Zambrano carers"). Nevertheless, Yong discusses the question only very briefly, and only with respect to the case where a dependent family member is cared for by a live-in caregiver migrant (and not by a family member with differing citizenship), and treats the overall issue as a marginal problem (p. 76).

In sum, this book presents many problems in contemporary political philosophy regarding migration. It is helpful and enlightening because it points to several of these problems at the same time as it exemplifies some of them.