The Ethics of Assistance: Morality and the Distant Needy

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Deen K. Chatterjee (ed.), The Ethics of Assistance: Morality and the Distant Needy, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 304pp, $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521527422.

Reviewed by Garrett Cullity, University of Adelaide


In the words of its editor, the aim of this collection is "to describe our duties to help those who are in need but who are strangers to us due to distance -- physical or otherwise." This covers a variety of possible projects, and several different ones are pursued by the impressive lineup of contributors Chatterjee has assembled: Peter Singer, Richard J. Arneson, F. M. Kamm, Judith Lichtenberg, Richard W. Miller, David Miller, Martha Nussbaum, Erin Kelly, Charles R. Beitz, Henry Shue, Onora O'Neill, and Thomas W. Pogge.

Actually, only one of these authors -- Kamm -- is concerned to discuss the moral significance of purely physical distance. Her essay looks at the different relationships of distance and proximity that might obtain between agents who can aid, strangers who need help, threats to those strangers, and means of helping them. According to Kamm, it is intuitive that we have a stronger duty to deal with a threat to a distant stranger when the threat is near to us.

It is the moral significance of co-citizenship, rather than physical proximity, that provides the focus of three other essays. The volume opens, fittingly, with a restatement by Singer of the views which, first advocated in his 1972 paper "Famine, Affluence and Morality", launched the debate in contemporary moral philosophy about the relationship between rich and poor. Here, Singer's emphasis is on distinguishing between defensible forms of partiality within personal relationships, and the indefensible privileging of compatriots when thinking about how we should respond to the needy. Against this, Richard Miller and David Miller both argue that co-citizenship is morally significant. Neither wants to claim that the basic needs of non-compatriots impose no moral requirements on us. However, David Miller argues against the view that we are required to secure global equality of opportunity: where political decisions are expressions of a common public culture, these can lead to inequalities that are a matter of national responsibility. This is interestingly related to the views Rawls sets out in more detail in The Law of Peoples, and a discussion of the points of difference would have helped to sharpen the articulation of Miller's position. For Rawls, duties of international assistance are primarily duties to assist peoples to constitute their own self-determining polities. (This is a picture that is vigorously attacked by several other contributors to the volume.) Miller does not go this far -- on his view, justice requires us to meet the basic needs of foreign individuals, and not just to secure the self-determination of peoples. However, both authors apparently rely on the thought that if my hardship results from group decisions in which I have participated, that weakens the reasons for requiring non-group members to assist me. Further work is called for to explain the kinds of participation in group decisions for which this is true, and why.

Richard Miller argues for a stronger thesis about the moral significance of citizenship. Co-participation in political institutions generates reasons for us to give the basic needs of our compatriots priority over those of foreigners. This, Miller argues, does not involve thinking of our compatriots as having greater moral worth than others. Rather, it involves a proper recognition of their equality as co-participants in a common project. A common project that forces life-diminishing harms on some in order to advantage others involves injustice, since it involves a failure of equal respect. This is not to say that our duties to help others are limited to our compatriots, though. Our participation in international institutions equally generates duties to help those whom they forcibly disadvantage. However, Miller maintains that the duties of tax-financed international aid are weaker than the corresponding domestic duties, on the grounds that the international duty is shared, and transnational political coercion plays a relatively small role in global poverty. In addition to these duties of justice, there are duties of beneficence to help the needy, irrespective of one's political relationship to them; but these allow for latitude in choosing good causes which are closest to one's heart, and are limited by a permission not to risk worsening one's own life for the sake of helping others. Miller's paper is detailed and thoughtful, but overly condensed: one looks forward to seeing him develop arguments for his claims more fully elsewhere.

The direct concern of these four essays is with the question of the moral significance of distance, either physical or political, in determining our duties to the needy. The remainder of the volume deals with four related but different questions. Are the principal duties which the well-off bear towards the badly-off duties of justice or beneficence? How much are we required to give up in discharging those duties? Who are the parties to this moral relationship -- are they rich and poor individuals, Rawlsian "peoples", political states, or do they include powerful non-state institutions and agencies? And finally, given that duties of international assistance are often expressed through the assertion of universal human rights, how do we settle the content of such rights?

As just noted, Richard Miller maintains that duties of justice to help the poor internationally are relatively weak compared to those that apply domestically, in part on the grounds that international institutions are relatively unimportant in contributing to poverty. Thomas Pogge forcefully disputes this. He details the ways in which the rules of international economic interaction are shaped to favour the rich countries, and have the effect of progressively intensifying the disadvantages of the poor countries. Thinking of duties of rich to poor as duties of "assistance" involves neglecting the stronger, negative duties we have to remedy harms we are causing, and not to profit from injustice. This is a theme Pogge has developed in several different places. It raises some important questions about the distribution of the collective duties Pogge is arguing for onto the individual members of the groups that bear them. After all, a relatively complacent interpretation of the implications of his views for individuals seems possible. I do always try conscientiously in national elections to cast my vote for the party advocating the least unjust policies. In recent times, the party I have voted for has not been elected. How, then, do I bear responsibility for what is done by those who, despite the absence of any endorsement from me, act as my political representatives? Even when my preferred party has been elected, I did not support all of their policies. I would have voted for a party with more just policies, were one available. Moreover, my participation in global rules advantaging rich over poor is indirect in another way. I am a citizen of a nation (Australia) which participates in the forums that establish global rules of international interaction. However, its effect on the decisions made in those forums is limited. As it happens, Australia is a supporter of trade liberalisation (principally for reasons of domestic advantage, of course). But this makes it doubly hard to see how I am implicated in the imposition of global injustice. And yet … -- surely I am. If I enjoy great advantages, including the luxury of time for philosophical reflection, through the operation of a global order that is fundamentally unjust, it does not seem good enough for me to congratulate myself on my probity through occasionally casting a dissenting vote. These thoughts are not directly objections to what Pogge says. But they do suggest that what he says is not yet a full explanation of the moral unease which affluent individuals ought to feel about the world they inhabit.

The question how far moral obligations of rich to poor extend is one on which Singer, Arneson and Richard Miller all offer answers. One other contributor -- Lichtenburg -- raises the question in order to set it aside. The important task, she insists, is not to determine how extensive are the obligations of the well-off towards the poor, but how to motivate effective action. The reasons for thinking that it is bad that poverty is not addressed are plain: and given how bad this is, and how implausible it is to think that showing that the badness involves obligation-violation will motivate people to act, we should not be diverted into debates over the latter point. It is easy to see the sense in this: philosophers should not delude themselves into thinking that addressing questions about the demandingness of morality is itself a contribution towards addressing world poverty. However, the philosophical question is important. It is important to know what kind of life is morally justifiable. One cannot perform every admirable action: there are many worthy actions we are justified in electing not to pursue. Others are morally compulsory: there is no good moral justification for failing to perform them. It is important whether and to what extent responses to poverty fall into either category.

Three similar views are defended here. Singer and Miller both emphasize the way in which personal relationships are at the heart of a good life, and claim that the kinds of partiality involved in those relationships is morally defensible, but that benefiting others in a way that imposes no life-diminishing cost on oneself is morally required. There is a significant difference between them: Miller's view includes a latitude in allowing us not to perform beneficent actions which do the most good; Singer's apparently does not. Arneson's concern is to defend Singer's view -- the half of consequentialism, as Arneson puts it, which denies the existence of moral options (as distinct from the half which denies the existence of moral constraints). However, Arneson then sweetens this pill by making a distinction between wrongness and blameworthiness. Although it may be wrong not to prevent significantly bad things from happening without morally comparable cost, one need not be blameworthy for failing to do so.

Singer and Miller's appeal to the value of personal relationships in explaining the limits on the demands of beneficence suggests a promising line of argument. However, in my view, it does not do more than that. Personal relationships are good. But often, we find ourselves in situations in which it is not right to pursue a good, because there is something else we ought to be doing instead. And it might well be claimed that the situation of affluent people in a world in which others lack the basic means of subsistence is a situation of this kind. My own view is that a good argument can be made for holding that we are not morally required to sacrifice fundamental personal goods for the sake of helping others. But I cannot see that that argument is supplied here. What is stated is a plausible conclusion, but one that stands in need of further justification.

Questions about who exactly we should think of as the parties to the moral relationship between rich and poor are intelligently examined by Nussbaum and O'Neill. Attacking Rawls's The Law of Peoples, Nussbaum maintains that there are no good arguments for making peoples, rather than persons, the subjects of a theory of justice. O'Neill's essay focuses on the question of who we should treat as the primary agents of justice -- those that allocate and determine the obligations of secondary agents -- and argues that it is a mistake to assume that states must play this role.

The other three essays in the volume are concerned to ask how we should conceive of human rights. Of particular interest are the contributions by Beitz and Shue. As Beitz points out, orthodox philosophical discussion of human rights conceives of these as those rights possessed by all humans simply in virtue of their humanity; and it then seeks to identify what the justification might be for asserting the existence of any such rights, and asks whether any of the rights commonly held to have this status will plausibly qualify. In contrast to this approach, he recommends a "practical" conception of human rights: this involves examining the role human rights actually play in international discourse and practice, and then asking which conceptions of those rights will best play that role. Applying this to the right to a decent standard of living, for example, we should ask what standard it makes sense for the international community to aim to secure universally. In a similar vein, Shue urges on us an approach to human rights that sees them as a focus for cross-cultural convergence, providing a vocabulary for international moral dialogue.

This book suffers from some of the defects common to collections of this kind. Not all of the contributions are equally strong, there is some unevenness of focus, some of the essays are manifestos calling for further development, and some authors are primarily concerned to answer critics of their own previous work. Rawls is something of an absent guest, with several of the authors taking this as an opportunity to offer a critical discussion of The Law of Peoples. However, the volume contains some first-rate work, and gives a good sense both of the variety of different and interrelated questions in this area of moral philosophy, and the important contribution that contemporary philosophy can make to clear thinking about international morality. The pieces by Beitz, Shue, O'Neill and Pogge are particularly valuable in showing how a more practical engagement with the reality of international politics should inform philosophical discussion of the justification of international action.