The Ethics of Care and Empathy

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Michael Slote, The Ethics of Care and Empathy, Routledge, 2007, 133pp., $35.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415772013.

Reviewed by Lawrence Blum, University of Massachusetts, Boston


Michael Slote's The Ethics of Care and Empathy is an important contribution to the burgeoning literature on the ethics of care. Slote sees the feminist psychologist Carol Gilligan and the philosopher of education Nel Noddings as having initiated the current development of care ethics as a distinctive ethical approach. By and large, he does not engage with subsequent developments of care ethics by Annette Baier, Joan Tronto, Marilyn Friedman, Rita Manning, Margaret Walker, and others in the feminist tradition, although he very much recognizes the feminist sources of care ethics and is engaged with the issue of the possibly gendered character of care. (Virginia Held's important book The Ethics of Care emerged only a year before Slote's, but Slote associates his view with hers in certain respects.) Both Gilligan and Noddings stated or implied that care ethics makes up only a part of an overall ethic, and they and other care theorists have variously seen justice, rights, principle, or impartiality as distinct from care. Slote explicitly rejects this strand of thinking in claiming that care ethics provides a "comprehensive account of individual and political morality." In some cases he argues that something that might seem not to be a care ethics issue or distinction (e.g. between doing something and allowing the same thing to happen) can in fact be accounted for by a care perspective. In other cases he argues that the care approach differs from the approach in question, and is superior to it. For example, he argues that a liberal right to free speech rooted in the value of autonomy permits too much harm to others in the name of free speech, harm that would not be permitted on a care approach. Thus, where other philosophers have wanted to effect a rapprochement between care ethics and, say, liberalism, utilitarianism, or Kantianism, Slote wants to say that, at least in some areas, no rapprochement is possible and, moreover, where there is a difference, the care approach is superior.

Slote locates his brand of care ethics in the "moral sentimentalist" tradition, originating in the work of Hutcheson, Shaftesbury, Smith, and Hume. Fundamental moral distinctions arise from sentiment rather than from reason (though Slote provides a careful discussion of appropriate roles for reason in ethics, in Chapter 7: "Caring and Rationality"). In line with locating his view within a distinctive tradition within philosophy, Slote argues that his view supplies a theory of right action based on the motive of that action -- a motive of care or its components (especially empathy). "Care ethics treat acts as right or wrong, depending on whether they exhibit a caring or uncaring attitude/motivation on the part of the agent" (21). In an earlier work, Morality from Motives, Slote defended that general approach to right action, and there he identified it with virtue ethics. That is, on a virtue approach, what makes an act right is that it flows from motives attached to an appropriate virtue -- courage, compassion, and so on. In the book under review, the virtue framework is still present, but the emphasis is on care as a motive. Slote is right to note that his view is in a sense more "philosophical" than those of the early care ethicists in providing a criterion for evaluation of actions. Neither Noddings nor Gilligan directly or fully engaged with that issue. Their view of care was analogous to a virtue ethicist who sees the task of morality as the development of virtues but does not translate that view into a theory of right action. (And some virtue theories have eschewed a focus on right action as contrary to the distinctive contribution of virtue theory, and a care ethicist might take this view as well.)

Slote emphasizes the role of empathy in caring, and looks at the important work of the psychologist Martin Hoffman concerning the development of empathy in children (and its relation to cognitive development). He argues that "differences in the strength of normally or fully developed empathy correspond pretty well, I think, to differences in intuitive moral evaluation" (16). In Chapter 2, "Our Obligations to Help Others," he illustrates this view in a discussion of the issue made famous by Peter Singer, whether we have an equal obligation to help needy persons distant to and unknown to us compared to those in our immediate vicinity, when we are equally able to do both. Slote accepts the non-impartialist or non-consequentialist view that we have a stronger obligation to those nearby, and he considers and rejects other attempts (e.g. Kamm) to account for this moral relevance of distance. He claims that a person of normally developed empathic capacity would care more about the immediate than the distant needy person and offers this as an explanation of why we have more of an obligation to the former than the latter. He does not, however, deny some obligations toward the distant needy, a view suggested in Noddings' early work but later repudiated by her. Slote rightly argues that it is possible to care about the well-being of the distant needy -- although that caring might have a different overall psychic character than caring about one's friends -- and it is thus possible for his care-based ethic to explain the obligation to help them.

Slote's view on this matter allows a place for supererogation, a notion to which, as he sees it, Kantianism, consequentialism and Aristotelian virtue theory are inhospitable. Some people's empathic capacities substantially transcend the norm to supply as much, or almost as much, empathy for the distant needy as for those close by. When they act on that empathy, their action, he says, is supererogatory, and Slote rightly thinks this is the way most people think about help to the distant needy. Yet elements of Slote's view do not sit easily with the view that empathy greater than the norm is supererogatory. If the criterion for right action is that it be motivated by fully developed empathy, on what basis can Slote say that (action prompted by) empathy greater than this amount is morally superior to it (though not obligatory)? Doesn't Slote's view suggest something closer to Aristotle's doctrine of the mean -- both too much and too little (of empathy/caring, in this case) are deficient in relation to the virtuous mean? In fact Slote does say that certain forms of empathy involve "too much caring" (e.g. a wife's attachment to her husband in a bad relationship). He does not address how his account distinguishes these cases from those of "caring beyond the norm" that he sees as good, as supererogatory.

Slote recognizes a serious objection to his notion that our moral obligations or right actions track our sentiments in general, and our empathy in particular. It is that our empathy is often affected by distinctions we think are morally irrelevant, for example, race or gender. Slote answers this objection by saying that there is no evidence that racial favoritism in our sentiments is "natural." Rather, it is likely to be strongly influenced by social, cultural, and familial factors. In addition, whatever such bias there might be in children "might fade over time" with increasing cognitive maturity. The former observation poses a problem for Slote. Could not a proponent of the impartialist view that we have equal obligations to the distant needy say that whatever current distance-sensitive differences there are in our empathic responses are also a product of socialization? Since Slote acknowledges that some people do not have such differentiation in their empathy, couldn't the "empathy impartialist" say that human beings more generally are capable of developing such impartial empathy -- for example, if we try to socialize people away from bias in favor of fellow nationals, and take other steps such as the use of imaginative literature and film to make more salient the sufferings of distant others? Slote himself makes the latter point about the possibilities of moral education, which allows him to draw a distinction between the "normal" empathy as a current statistical matter, and "fully developed empathy" that has gone through a serious educative process. But that distinction raises questions about how Slote will be able to distinguish a pure "natural," partialist empathy, that he wants to use as a basis for saying what is right and wrong, from a socially-influenced empathy.

In Chapter 3, "Deontology," Slote accepts the deontological view that there is a significant moral difference between causing something to happen and allowing it to happen. He attempts to explain this on his sentimentalist view by saying that our empathy is sensitive to our causal relationship to events, somewhat analogously to what he has said about the moral relevance of distance. Acts we cause, or the prospect of causing them, have a greater "immediacy" than those caused by others. So we flinch from harming others ourselves more strongly than we do from a third party's causing the same harm.

This explanation does not seem to me to appeal to empathy. Empathy is focused on the other's suffering; but the emotional reaction involved in (prospective) agency is not directed simply to the other's suffering but to our own agentic role in that suffering. It is more natural to think of the "flinching" as related to (agentic) guilt than to empathy. This view could still be seen as sentimentalist, perhaps, but not care-ist. However, even that view does not capture the significance we generally attach to agency. If I order A to harm B but not to tell me that or how he has done so, I have distanced myself from the causal immediacy of the harm but have not reduced my agency or moral responsibility.

In Chapter 4, "Autonomy and Empathy," Slote faces two objections to care ethics:  that it cannot account for the value of autonomy which both seems, or is often thought to be, grounded in rationality, and also that it can appropriately outweigh welfare, as when someone autonomously chooses to do something that harms her interests. Slote answers these objections by saying that autonomy (roughly understood as making and acting on one's decisions) is part of a person's good; so if that person (say, one's child) is the object of one's care, one cares about (promoting and respecting) her autonomy. By affirming autonomy as part of someone's good, Slote is also enabled to meet the criticism sometimes lodged by feminists against care ethics, that it promotes selflessness and self-sacrifice at the expense of autonomy.

In Chapter 5, "Care Ethics versus Liberalism," Slote reiterates his earlier argument that care ethics differs from liberalism in not giving as much rein to free speech, for example, in the form of hate speech, and that we should prefer the care approach to the liberal one. He also provides an extended discussion of care and gender. He argues that women are, on the average, more likely to possess the virtue of care than men, although the main reason for this is likely to be socialization. However, Slote says it is likely that even if men and women were equally socialized to be caring and empathetic, there might well be a physiological difference (related to testosterone) that favors women in the development of empathy. Slote embraces, then, the likelihood that on the average women are morally superior to men, if care is the basis of morality. He tries to make this conclusion palatable to men by suggesting that men are not fully responsible for this moral inferiority, since it has a biological basis beyond their control.

This discussion raises a problem for Slote. First, if men and women have differing empathy potentialities, it might seem to follow that the two genders should be thought of as having different standards for "fully developed empathy," or that Slote will have to choose one of the genders as the human standard and this may seem to be arbitrary. This "gender relativity" raises the suspicion that there are also culturally significant differences in norms of empathy development, which would raise similar problems.

In Chapter 5, Slote criticizes what he sees as an extreme or distorted conception of autonomy, one (articulated by Nussbaum) involving taking a critical stance toward all of one's beliefs and emotional attachments (scrutiny precedes attachments, in his characterization of the view in question). His rejection of this notion places Slote's own view closer to the "relational" one developed by feminists, and Slote embraces that result. In Chapter 6, "Social Justice," Slote argues that we can speak of institutions and laws as "caring" or exhibiting empathy, or not, and thus can use the same criterion as in the individual case for their moral assessment. He argues that empathy can account for social injustice in that elites who fail to accord political rights are motivated by greed and selfishness. Here, as elsewhere, Slote seems to be arguing that care ethics will provide the same moral evaluation that other moral standards do; but sometimes he seems to be taking the stronger position that care/empathy actually captures the character of our moral intuitions about justice, (appropriate) freedom of speech, and the like. The stronger view is certainly incorrect, except perhaps regarding the issue of obligations to distant others, where philosophers have failed to forge any consensus on the existence and character of such obligations. It is surely implausible to say that care for the exploited or unjustly disadvantaged is the same as, or explains, the moral intuition that such-and-such a situation constitutes injustice. Care is simply distinct from injustice. But if so, the weaker thesis is also questionable. What we are prompted to do by justice or respect for rights is unlikely to align precisely with what care prompts (even when both are restricted to what is morally right).

Let me raise one final concern. Slote's focus on care as a motive to action to improve the other's situation, to be used as a criterion for right action, omits some important aspects of the value of care as a human sentiment. We value other people's care for us not only because it leads them to help us when we are in need, but also for its own sake, and even when the other is not able to do anything for us in the way of action. Just knowing that the other cares can be important to us, a point emphasized in Noddings's Caring. Slote rightly distinguishes two strands in care theory, that he (also rightly) claims are often insufficiently distinguished -- a concern with care as a sentiment, and a concern with promoting caring relationships. There is a distinction here, but it is not as sharp as Slote implies. Part of why caring relationships are of human value is that we want to be cared for by (certain) others, to be the objects of their sentiment of care.