The Ethics of Climate Engineering: Solar Radiation Management and Non-Ideal Justice

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Toby Svoboda, The Ethics of Climate Engineering: Solar Radiation Management and Non-Ideal Justice, Routledge, 2017, 176pp., $140.00, ISBN 9781138204836.

Reviewed by Corey Katz, The Ohio State University


Solar radiation management (SRM) names a suite of large-scale, intentional climate engineering techniques whose purpose is to reflect a small proportion of incoming solar radiation back into space. This leads to less solar energy entering or remaining in the atmosphere, which in turn leads to a decrease in global average temperature. Much attention has focused, for example, on the possibility of emitting reflective sulfate aerosols into the atmosphere that would artificially cool the planet. While the technology is still in the research stage, SRM has the potential to both relatively quickly and comparatively cheaply lessen or halt global warming. This has made its deployment both attractive and controversial.

SRM has faced considerable ethical concerns. Could the development of this technology create a "moral hazard," enticing wealthy or powerful states to use it in place of meeting their moral duty to reduce their emissions? Is specifically unilateral SRM deployment ethically permissible? Would it affect the climate in ways that create new burdens to those already the least responsible for current atmospheric greenhouse-gas concentrations? Would it force future generations into having to continue pumping sulfates into the atmosphere, or else face rapid global warming? Is the desire to intentionally control the Earth's climate just another expression of the human arrogance and hubris that got us into the climate problem in the first place?

Toby Svoboda navigates these worries and makes the case that, in certain situations, it would be ethically justifiable to deploy SRM technology. He argues that we should think about climate policy in terms of "non-ideal justice." This is because the past thirty years have shown that climate action by developed countries that meets broadly agreed-upon ideals of distributive fairness faces serious feasibility constraints. Given that the possibility of achieving the ideal is distant, we should instead think about climate policy in terms of achieving the best we can. While the use of SRM might never be ideal, we can ask whether it would be non-ideally just. To this question, Svoboda's book answers a qualified "yes." He sets himself the task of a providing deeper theoretical grounding to claims made by some that SRM could justifiably be deployed if it played the specific role of "reducing climatic harm or buying time for emissions mitigation" (p. 47).

The core of Svoboda's argument is his account of non-ideal justice, more specifically of "clinical theory," a term he borrows from the work of David Wiens (2012). Clinical theory can be differentiated from "ideal theory," in that those who engage in it do not give an account of the principles that institutions or policies ideally ought to meet. It can also be differentiated from "transitional theory," in that those who engage in it do not develop principles that guide action towards the creation of institutions or policies that meet an ideal. Rather, clinical theorists engage in "theorizing that prescribes feasible institutional solutions to actual injustice" (Wiens, 2012, p. 46).

On Svoboda's view, in a non-ideal situation, we ought to pursue a policy that is (1) politically feasible, (2) likely to be effective and (3) is morally permissible. A policy is morally permissible if and only if (i) it is proportional, in that the moral ills it carries are proportionate to the moral goods it achieves (e.g., human welfare, distributive justice, procedural justice, etc.), and (ii) it is comparable, in that it compares favorably to other effective and feasible policies in terms of that proportion (p. 47). Moreover, in Chapter 1, Svoboda argues that it is mistake to think that we can determine proportionality here via simple consequentialist aggregation. Instead, doing so will require weighing incommensurable moral goods and ills. Even so, despite the fact that a policy carries "axiological injustice," if it meets criteria (1)-(3), then it may be, all things considered, "deontologically just" (pp. 43-44).

Let's say that we have developed SRM techniques that meet (2) because they are likely to be effective. Would a policy of SRM deployment meet (1) and (3) and thereby be what we ought to do today? First, SRM deployment is likely to be politically feasible because of its lower cost and complexity than large-scale, economy-wide emissions reductions. Yet, Svoboda argues that fully multilateral deployment of SRM is unlikely because of the numerous places in such a policy where disagreement is likely. As he states, "different parties might have conflicting preferences regarding the intensity of cooling to be administered, the location of deployment, the timescale for deployment, other measures to accompany SRM . . . and whether SRM should be used at all" (50). Thus, he argues that only deployment by one agent ("unilateral") or a few agents ("minilateral") is politically feasible.

Second, would such deployment meet (3) by being morally permissible? Svoboda argues that deployment might provide large moral goods "perhaps by slowing the rate of climate change and thus buying time for a large-scale transition to renewable energy, [and] for vulnerable parties to adapt to changing environmental conditions" (p. 48). These goods might outweigh its moral ills, for example, causing droughts in some regions. Yet, given the "global impacts and high stakes of SRM," any unilateral or minilateral SRM deployment would come along with massive procedural injustice, because it would fail to distribute decision-making power to those affected (p. 49). Svoboda argues that, at least given our situation today, this moral bad outweighs any moral goods unilateral or multilateral SRM deployment might provide. Therefore, SRM deployment does not appear even non-ideally just today.

Of course, whether a particular SRM policy fails to meet the criteria depends on the situation. Indeed, Svoboda argues that an SRM policy may be non-ideally just in a future "pessimistic scenario." A pessimistic scenario is one in which all courses of action, including inaction, have great moral ills. For example, we might reach a point where "emissions mitigation cannot ameliorate committed climate change, adaptation is limited in terms of what goods it can protect, carbon dioxide removal may not be scalable to the extend needed, and SRM has the various drawback we have reviewed" (p. 130). In this scenario, it is morally permissible for future policy-makers to choose "the least of all evils," the all-things-considered best of their bad available options (p. 125). The least of all evils in a pessimistic climate scenario, Svododa claims, is likely to include deploying SRM unilaterally or minilaterally. Despite the procedural justice this will perpetrate, in the pessimistic scenario this will likely be outweighed by the moral benefits of cooling the climate quickly and better managing climate risks (p. 147).

Importantly, Svoboda does not claim that, even in a pessimistic scenario, an SRM-only policy would be comparatively the best. This is because SRM "would not address the problem of future emissions and the risks of harm and injustice that such emissions would carry" (p. 147). Instead, SRM will be non-ideally just only if it is deployed temporarily as part of a hybrid policy that "involves short-term SRM in order to provide time for emissions mitigation and adaptation" (p. 147). Moreover, such a hybrid policy should minimize other risks of injustice (pp. 150-153). Making SRM deployment temporary avoids worries about locking future generations into continuing it. Only the minimal amount of aerosols needed to slow warming could be deployed, in order to minimize risks. They could be deployed in the global North to put most of the environmental costs where they could be most easily handled, and so on.

Despite the risks of distributive and especially procedural justice, in a future pessimistic scenario, a hybrid-SRM policy may be effective, feasible and morally permissible as the least of all evils. Even so, Svoboda concludes that those who enact it should do so reluctantly and with an attitude of regret for the remaining axiological injustice of the policy and for the failures of their predecessors that put them in a pessimistic scenario in the first place (p. 135). As he writes, "if it happens in the future that we find ourselves in the scenario in which SRM is, morally speaking, the thing to do, that would indicate a massive moral failure on the part of many of us" (p. 6).

There are things to like about Svoboda's approach. I appreciate his work clearing a space to have a serious discussion about SRM. He criticizes those who construct and then tear down straw-man, SRM-only arguments that no SRM proponents support (p. 148). He notes that, as things stand, moral hazard worries about SRM are empirically unfounded (pp. 51, 155). He agrees that the "climate emergency" framing in the SRM debate is dangerous, and shows the value of turning to a non-ideal justice framing instead (pp. 96-97). Finally, in Chapter 5, Svoboda points out some of the difficulties with Stephen Gardiner's argument (2010) that any situation where SRM is deployed as the lesser evil will in fact be an intractable moral dilemma. Svoboda has written a book that does a good job staking a place in the debate around the ethics of SRM, while still serving as good introduction. It also contributes to growing reflection on the relationship between climate change and non-ideal theories of justice (cf. Caney, 2016; Heyward & Roser, 2016; Maltais, 2014; Tan, 2015).

That said, sometimes it is not clear who, specifically, is the intended audience. While Svoboda does contribute to the academic debate on the ethics of climate engineering, at times he frames things in a way that suggests that his audience is policy-makers or engineers. For example, Chapter 1 recounts worries with a simple form of consequentialism that are long-established in the academic literature. In fact, here Svoboda notes that his aim is not to argue against more sophisticated consequentialist approaches but to correct those who appeal to a "relatively simple, broadly utilitarian line of thinking" to justify SRM research (p. 9). Another example is the discussion in Chapter 5 on the virtues and vices of climate engineers, and his discussion of the vicious persona of the "Satisfied Climate Engineer" (p. 127) and the virtuous persona of the "Tentative Climate Engineer" (p. 134). In my view, this discussion was framed in a way that might make it appealing to engineering ethics students, but was extraneous to Svoboda's core argument. Finally, while Svoboda shows the value of clinical theory for thinking through the ethics of climate engineering, he does not engage with the wider literature on non-ideal justice. For example, given the role feasibility constraints play in his account, I was looking for some engagement with the literature on that topic (cf. Gheaus, 2013; Gilabert and Lawford-Smith, 2012; Hamlin and Stemplowska, 2012; Lawford-Smith, 2013)

Finally, Svoboda argues that a hybrid policy that minimizes SRM's moral ills could be non-ideally just in a future pessimistic scenario but, according to his account of non-ideal justice, it is not today. I wonder why not. If we accept that the situation is such that we need to take a non-ideal approach to climate justice, and if we could act quickly to develop effective SRM, why should it and the moral goods it can provide not be in the mix of the current climate policy of those states able to deploy it?

Svoboda might argue that, given the procedural injustice of the requisite unilateral or minilateral deployment, a hybrid-SRM policy is morally impermissible today because it fails to meet the proportionality condition. Yet, in the future hybrid policy he envisions, SRM deployment buys time for emissions reductions and reduces their cost. If it could do those things today, perhaps the procedural injustice is worth it.

Svoboda might push back and argue that the moral goods that the unilateral or minilateral SRM deployment would have to secure "would need to be very great in order for proportionality to hold" (p. 91). But which goods and how much of them are great enough to outweigh the procedural injustice? As Svoboda himself notes, including SRM in a hybrid policy could slow warming, thereby lowering the cost of emissions cuts (p. 155). This could serve as an incentive for states who have so far not found it feasible to engage in mitigation. How could we tell that the procedural injustice of their minilateral enactment of a hybrid-SRM policy is morally worse than, say, the moral ills of the continued rise in global average temperature?

Instead, Svoboda might argue that enacting a hybrid-SRM policy today would be morally impermissible because it fails the comparativity condition. That is, the reason why a hybrid-SRM policy is morally permissible in a future pessimistic scenario is because every feasible option produces moral ills that outweigh moral bads. In such a situation, as he argues, we should choose the least bad. Today, we might think, there is an option that does better than a unilateral or minilateral hybrid-SRM policy: a multilateral policy involving immediate and deep emissions reductions by developed countries. That would clearly be morally better than a unilateral or minilateral hybrid-SRM policy, but that policy is not feasible. Of the currently feasible policies, therefore, it may be that unilateral or minilateral deployment of SRM in order to buy time for, or reduce the costs of, deep emissions reductions is comparatively best.

In short, it may be that Svoboda's approach supports deployment of SRM in more situations than he realizes. Whether this is a design feature or a design flaw will depend on who you ask. In the end then, one thing Svoboda's account shows us is that we are still at the beginning of serious ethical reflection on SRM.


Caney, S. (2016). The struggle for climate justice in a non-ideal world. Midwest Studies In Philosophy, 40(1), 9–26. 


Gardiner, S. (2010). Is “arming the future” with geoengineering really the lesser evil? Some doubts about the ethics of intentionally manipulating the climate system. In S. M. Gardiner, S. Caney, D. Jamieson, and H. Shue (Eds.), Climate ethics: Essential readings (pp. 284–314). Oxford University Press.


Gheaus, A. (2013). The feasibility constraint on the concept of justice. The Philosophical Quarterly, 63(252), 445–464. 


Gilabert, P., and Lawford-Smith, H. (2012). Political feasibility: A conceptual exploration. Political Studies, 60(4), 809–825. 


Hamlin, A., and Stemplowska, Z. (2012). Theory, ideal theory and the theory of ideals. Political Studies Review, 10(1), 48–62.


Heyward, C., and Roser, D. (Eds.). (2016). Climate justice in a non-ideal world. Oxford University Press.


Lawford-Smith, H. (2013). Understanding political feasibility. Journal of Political Philosophy, 21(3), 243–259. 


Maltais, A. (2014). Failing international climate politics and the fairness of going first. Political Studies, 62(3), 618–633.


Tan, K.-C. (2015). Individual duties of climate justice under non-ideal conditions. In J. Moss (Ed.), Climate change and justice (pp. 129–147). Cambridge University Press.


Wiens, D. (2012). Prescribing institutions without ideal theory. Journal of Political Philosophy, 20(1), 45–70.