The Ethics of Emmanuel Levinas

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Diane Perpich, The Ethics of Emmanuel Levinas, Stanford University Press, 2008, 230pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804759434.

Reviewed by Lisa Guenther, Vanderbilt University


This is a book that many readers and teachers of Levinas have been waiting for. It offers a clear, insightful explanation of Levinas' most basic concepts -- alterity, responsibility, the face -- while also challenging some common interpretations of these concepts and advancing an original, sophisticated reading of Levinas. As such, it provides an important resource for both new and experienced readers of Levinas.

Perpich locates the greatest strength of Levinas' work in its articulation of the fragility of ethics, its frustrating ambiguity in the midst of a desire for absolute ethical imperatives. Levinas demonstrates both how important it is to cut through moral ambiguity and provide an absolute, indestructible basis for responsibility, and also how impossible it is to guarantee this command absolutely. On Perpich's reading, the uncertainty of ethical life, and the commitment to ethics in the midst of this uncertainty, is crucial to Levinas' project rather than destructive of it.

The scholarship in this book is impressive. Perpich draws on a wide range of primary and secondary sources, carefully documenting the shifts in Levinas' thought through a reading of major works and less familiar essays, as well as untranslated secondary literature from French scholars such as Jacques Rolland, Gérard Bailhache and others. She brings a fresh, critical and utterly clear voice to the growing discussion of Levinas' work in the context of normative ethical and political theory.

The style of analysis is both critical and constructive. Perpich is very attentive to the gaps in Levinas' texts: the missing arguments, the lack of sufficient ground for certain hyperbolic claims, the evasion of certain questions (such as whether the animal has a face). But she also seeks to provide the grounds, to make the arguments, and to raise the difficult but necessary questions to allow for a deeper appreciation and a wider application of Levinas' ethical approach. See, for example, the perceptive discussion of universality in relation to both Levinas and feminist ethics (pp. 135-40).

The book is divided into six chapters. Each of the first four discusses a single concept in depth (alterity, singularity, responsibility and ethics). The final two chapters consider the relevance of Levinas' thought for two contemporary ethical-political issues: environmental ethics and the treatment of non-human animals, and identity politics. This structure allows Perpich both to explain Levinas' work on its own terms and also to challenge this work to address issues which Levinas himself did not consider, or considered only marginally (and sometimes, as in the case of racial and religious diversity, considered rather poorly).

Chapter One traces Levinas' concept of alterity through his early, middle and late works, arguing that alterity is not a matter of difference (in the sense of contextual, relational, determinate differences) or otherness (in the sense of an oppositional difference between the self and non-self) but rather singularity. In order to understand what singularity means for Levinas, we must understand his account of transcendence, which both refers to the phenomenological tradition and diverges significantly from it. Perpich does a brilliant job of contextualizing Levinas' account of transcendence in relation to Husserl, Heidegger and Jean Wahl (pp. 23-30). She argues that for Levinas, the transcendence of the other does not indicate an otherworldly presence, but rather a transcendence in the flesh, within finite being; only as such can transcendence open an escape from the suffocating plenitude of being (pp. 30-8). This opening of transcendence within the immanence of being makes possible a relation to the other which is not reducible to a comprehension or appropriation: a "relation without relation" in which the other is greeted or received without becoming known.

Chapter Two develops the connection between alterity and singularity by reflecting on the other's resistance to comprehension, which is expressed in the face. The face cannot be described or represented, since it is not a phenomenon with particular qualities, presented in the context of a horizon, positioned in relation to other objects, and so forth; and yet, it is also not a mere abstraction or mystical apparition. Rather, the face has an ethical meaning; it presents itself to me as the irreducible presence of a mortal and vulnerable other with whom I am in a social relation, whether I like it or not. This presentation already expresses the command not to murder; it already conveys an ethical resistance which puts my powers in question and asks me to justify myself. In this sense, the face is discursive more than visual; it commands me and calls for a response. Perpich not only explains how the face functions for Levinas, she also explores some of the contradictions which both prevent us from offering a definitive explanation of the face and also reinforce its ethical resistance, its transcendence of philosophical discourse from within (pp. 62-77). For me, some of the most powerful insights of the book occur at the end of this chapter.

Chapter Three develops the claim that what might first appear to be a weakness in Levinas' ethics -- his failure to provide an absolute basis for ethical life through a definitive and non-contradictory account of the face -- turns out to be one of the greatest strengths of his work. In other words, ethics is not about securing moral certainty: "to be ethical in Levinas's sense is to know that ethics is in danger" (p. 77). The focus of Chapter Three is Levinas' concept of responsibility, especially as articulated in Totality and Infinity. The main claim here is that the demand for ethical justification is not issued once and for all in a momentous encounter with the stranger, but that it is renewed at every moment, in every conversation with every other. Here, Perpich helpfully distinguishes between responsibility and guilt, and discusses the relationship between responsibility and freedom; she also gives a brief but important reading of the feminine other in Levinas' work (pp. 102-8).

Chapter Four takes up once again the problem of ethical certainty, and the impossible (but necessary) desire for an absolute foundation for ethics, by responding to the challenge of skepticism and considering the possibility of developing Levinas' ethics of responsibility into a normative ethical framework. This chapter marks a turning-point in the book between critical exposition and the creative application and development of Levinas' ideas. Perpich argues that Levinas' philosophy gives us an account of "normativity without norms" (p. 126); he tells us why we are responsible for others, but not how to make good on this responsibility. To provide particular norms of action would risk betraying the singularity of each other in response to whom I am called to justify myself anew at every moment. This lack of norms may be frustrating, but it also underscores the strength of Levinas' ethics. The question remains open whether it is possible, or perhaps even necessary, for Levinas' readers to develop the account of norms that he fails or refuses to provide. What would be gained, and what lost, in such a development?

In this context, Perpich argues that the face may be understood as "the site of normativity but not its origin or source" (pp. 127-8). We could think of God as this source, but we could just as well argue that there is no such source, that there is ultimately nothing that "causes" or guarantees responsibility. This fragility of ethical command leaves Levinas' philosophy open to a skeptical refutation that cannot be dispelled once and for all through philosophical argumentation. There will always be someone who asks, "What is Hecuba to me? Am I my brother's keeper?" Even if the very posing of this question entails a performative contradiction, in the sense that one confirms the vocative dimension of ethical address by posing one's skeptical question to someone, this contradiction continues to haunt ethical life as one of its constitutive risks.

A question that remains for me after reading this chapter involves a different sort of ethical danger in which responsibility is not so much rejected in skepticism but ignored or overlooked in moral blindness. What happens when the provocation of the other is not even felt strongly enough to be denied in a dramatic and skeptical gesture? How well does Levinas' ethics of responsibility deal with the patterns of exclusion and structural violence that make the most vulnerable others the least often seen or heard? It may be the case that even the desire to murder confirms the alterity of the other. But what about those innumerable others who are merely left to die, without even provoking the ferocious passions of the murderer? These questions are suggested by the topics raised in the final chapter, but remain to be developed at length.

Chapter Five broaches the topic of responsibility for non-human others such as animals and ecosystems. Perpich makes an admirably clear and persuasive argument that the issue of non-human others is best dealt with in relation to Levinas' politics rather than his ethics. It makes more sense to consider animals as "third persons" in relation to whom we must balance and negotiate our responsibilities, rather than others who command us to infinite responsibility, and so open the very dimension of ethical life. This does not mean we are any less responsible for animals than for human others, but rather that ethical life first takes root in the interhuman encounter in which I am commanded to justify myself in language. This approach gets around the troublesome and, in my view, irresolvable question of whether non-human others have faces in the same sense as human others, and puts the focus where it should be: on the difficult and ethically necessary task of figuring out how to follow through on our manifold and often competing responsibilities to many different others. Here again, Levinas offers an account of why we must work through these responsibilities, but cannot offer a set of norms for guaranteeing good outcomes.

Finally, Chapter Six addresses the issue of normativity in relation to identity politics, in a way that both argues for Levinas' relevance to these discussions and also invites further reflection from feminists and critical race theorists. Perpich defends Levinas' focus on singularity as a way of putting in question rigid social differences without appealing to a shared identity. She appeals to Levinas' concept of a "work" to discuss how the singular "who" gets reduced to a mere "what" in situations of racist, sexist, classist and other forms of oppression. Like a social identity, a work is both the product of an individual will and also a public entity exposed to the will of others who interpret it, appropriate it and so forth. But the work of identity only tells us what someone is, not who they are, and so any politics based on identity forecloses the singularity of the other, shutting down the space of ethical life. For me, this is the least convincing argument of the book, if only because it does not receive the meticulous and exhaustive articulation of the other chapters. I am left with the impression that Levinas' ethics may explain why we need a critique of oppression that is sensitive to the singularity of others, but that it may not provide the tools to analyze the structural inequalities that betray this singularity in the first place.

In conclusion, this book offers something to both the beginning reader of Levinas and the advanced scholar. Those schooled in the analytic tradition will find a clear presentation of Levinas' main concepts and arguments, contextualized within debates over normativity, and those schooled in the continental tradition will find a subtle and perceptive discussion sof Levinas' relation to Husserl and Heidegger, Derrida's reading of Levinas, and Janicaud's critique of the "theological turn" in Levinas. Perpich is conversant in both philosophical discourses, and this book provides us with one of those rare but indispensable bridges between them.