The Ethics of Forgiveness: A Collection of Essays

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Christel Fricke (ed.), The Ethics of Forgiveness: A Collection of Essays, Routledge, 2011, 212pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415885430.

Reviewed by Linda Radzik, Texas A&M University


Christel Fricke's rich collection of essays arose from a conference held in Oslo in 2008 on Charles L. Griswold's 2007 book Forgiveness. However, very little of the text is spent critiquing Griswold's work. Instead, Fricke's authors use Griswold's text as a map that points to areas worthy of further exploration. Like Griswold, most of these writers resist the temptation to develop simple, unified accounts of forgiveness and instead dedicate themselves to plotting the complexities of human interaction in the aftermath of wrongdoing. The examples the authors use along the way range from subtle, personal failings to large-scale atrocities. While most of the contributions are works in moral theory, the volume also represents other disciplinary approaches to issues of forgiveness, including literary criticism and linguistics. The result is a satisfyingly diverse range of perspectives on the nature, justification and limits of forgiveness.

Part I includes a pair of essays dedicated to the interpretation of particular, historical traditions of forgiveness. In "Forgiveness and Forbearance in Ancient China," Christoph Harbsmeier surveys the language of forgiveness in Chinese, arguing that, "for a Chinese person to forgive, is always to forgive 'in terms of' one of the concepts outlined" (21). Harbsmeier goes on to present twenty-nine different terms in ancient and modern Chinese related to "forgiveness." To me, their differences were not as remarkable as their similarity. All seemed to portray forgiveness as a matter of letting the wrongdoer off, in some way, from the possible consequences of wrongdoing. Shù, which Harbsmeier suggests as the best translation for 'forgiveness,' involves a general sort of empathetic forbearance.

So far, the virtue of shù will seem familiar enough to contemporary Westerners. But Harbsmeier emphasizes that it must be understood in a hierarchically structured culture, where, he tells us, "egalitarianism is not in any way envisaged or aspired to at any level, practical or psychological" (13). Shù is something one shows to people below oneself on the social scale. What one owes to people above oneself is, in contrast, zhong, "doing one's moral best" (22). When those above oneself commit wrongs, then, the question of forgiveness does not really arise. Instead the question for the underling is how to continue to do his duty to his superior in this new context. Harbsmeier's analysis helps explain, for example, why in China the question "whether they forgive or do not forgive Deng Xiaoping [for the Tiananmen Square massacre of 1989] has become purely academic (i.e., quite irrelevant)" (14).

Ilaria E. Ramelli's contribution on forgiveness in Christian thought argues that what is almost invariably labeled as "the Christian view" is historically inaccurate. It is commonplace for contemporary writers on the ethics of forgiveness to assert that Christianity requires its followers to forgive wrongs unconditionally, that is, to forgive whether or not their abusers have met any conditions, such as apologizing, repenting or making amends. Ramelli painstakingly reviews an impressive range of ancient sources to show that, throughout the early history of Christianity, forgiveness was always predicated on repentance. Her argument is so convincing that I was left wondering how it has come to be that most contemporary writers -- and, I would add, all my students who self-identify as Christians -- have come to see a commitment to unconditional forgiveness as central to Christianity.

Part II on "Forgiveness and Selfhood" begins with Fricke's contribution, "What We Cannot Do to Each Other: On Forgiveness and Moral Vulnerability." Fricke provides an admirable description of the normative terrain of forgiveness and specifically the interconnections between moral and social norms. Fricke anchors her discussion of forgiveness in a social, relational understanding of the nature and consequences of moral wrongdoing. Wrongdoing damages the trust that normally marks relations among victims, wrongdoers and their communities; forgiveness is one way of repairing that damage.

Fricke goes on to emphasize that, as complex selves, we relate to one another, not just as moral agents, but also as friends, partners and neighbors. This leads her to distinguish between personal forgiveness, in which personal relationships such as friendships are repaired, and moral forgiveness, in which victims come to once again see their abusers as having intrinsic moral value as human beings. She argues plausibly that one may morally forgive a wrongdoer without personally forgiving. I was less convinced by her claim that "personal forgiveness always implies moral forgiveness" because "any close personal relationship includes mutual respect of moral value or dignity" (63). Might not someone who does not value humanity as such (say, a mafia hitman) value his personal relationships (with other mafiosos)? This combination of attitudes may not be able to be held in a fully, rationally consistent way, but it seems psychologically possible. The last portion of the essay poses the question of whether wrongdoers can deserve forgiveness and victims can be morally required to forgive in either of the two senses of forgiveness; however, Fricke provides no clear answers to those questions.

The next pair of articles pursues Griswold's claim that forgiveness requires a narration of the past, one which will both acknowledge its wrongful character yet allow for the forgiver to overcome her negative attitudes toward the wrongdoer. Garry L. Hagberg and Peter Goldie each ask how this might work in cases of self-forgiveness. Both worry whether "in self-forgiveness there is not the possibility of a narrative accounting from an appropriate distanced perspective" (Goldie, 83-4). In "Self-Forgiveness and the Narrative Sense of Self," Goldie suggests that such distancing is enabled by the wrongdoer's ability to think about herself in a way that is "essentially ironic" and involves seeing one's past, wrongdoing self as, in a sense, another person (87):

This opens up the epistemic and evaluative ironic gap that is at the heart of the notion of narrative: an epistemic gap because one now knows what one did not know then; and an evaluative gap because one can now take an evaluative stance which differs from the stance that one took then (87).

Hagberg, in "Forgiveness and the Constitution of Selfhood," rejects this dyadic view of the self as phenomenologically inaccurate. Instead, he believes that self-forgiveness is enabled by "one identity seeing bi-focally, not two persons gazing from a distance upon each other" (75). Hagberg draws on literary concepts to explain his view, comparing self-forgiveness to the experience of reading fiction, wherein "we simultaneously identify with a character in fiction but also stand apart from that narratively-entwined persona" (75). For Hagberg, this narrative process is not performed by a later self that is independently distinguishable from the wrongdoing self, but is instead what constitutes the new, forgivable self. Both Goldie's and Hagberg's essays provide satisfyingly complex examples of processes of self-forgiveness. Goldie's essay is also notable for its discussion of the odd case of self-pardoning, in which one regards one's own action as involuntary on the grounds that the circumstances overstrained one's nature without actually undermining one's freedom.

Part III includes six essays that address the limits of forgiveness, that is, a variety of possible restrictions on the possibility or permissibility of forgiveness. For example, almost all theorists of forgiveness claim that forgiveness is not possible where there is no wrong. But in "Forgiveness Without Blame," Espen Gamlund defends the position that forgiveness can occur even when harm-causing is not blameworthy but rather excused or justified. Cases of agent-regret (such as the regret felt by an unlucky driver who faultlessly kills a child), disagreements over culpability between the harmed and the harm-causer, and moral dilemmas all present disruptions to peace of mind and social relations that can be solved by the sorts of interactions and changes in view that we associate with forgiveness and self-forgiveness. While critics may insist that forgiveness requires culpability by definition, Gamlund's discussion will lead many readers to find such a stipulation unsatisfying.

A major debate in the literature on forgiveness is whether forgiveness is "conditional," meaning that forgiveness is only appropriate in cases where the wrongdoer has met some sort of requirement, such as repentance or moral improvement. Jerome Neu's essay, "On Loving Our Enemies," defends the conditional view. Drawing on work by Jeffrie Murphy, Neu argues that resentment is a morally appropriate reaction to being victimized that can be set aside only for a moral reason. Also working within a conditional framework, Arne Johan Vetlesen asks whether there are cases where no moral reason could justify forgiveness and where forgiveness is, therefore, wrong. In this rather unwieldy essay, Vetlesen emphasizes the relevance of the characteristics of the wrongful acts themselves, rather than the characteristics of the agents who perform the acts, claiming that "some acts are worse, morally speaking, than any individual agent" (161).

Eve Garrard and David McNaughton, in contrast to Neu and Vetlesen, defend the position that forgiveness is unconditional by addressing objections posed by Griswold and others. The authors argue that some critics of unconditional forgiveness conflate two senses in which forgiveness can be unconditional: "(1) forgiving no matter what condition the wrongdoer is in; and (2) forgiving no matter what the reason for doing so is" (102). While defending the view that "there is sufficient reason to forgive a wrongdoer whatever his state of mind" (97), Garrard and McNaughton go on to identify reasons for extending such unmerited forgiveness. While the points made in favor of unconditional forgiveness are perhaps not novel, the skill with which the issues are explained and defended makes this essay a good candidate for course syllabuses on forgiveness.

Geoffrey Scarre strays slightly from the theme of forgiveness to look at issues of apology. In "Apologising for Historic Injustices," Scarre dives into the controversy surrounding Australia's official apology to the "Stolen Generations," which addressed the century-long practice of removing aboriginal children from their parents' care, a practice that ended only in the late 1960s or early 1970s. In 2008, Prime Minister Kevin Rudd delivered an official apology for this history, which was met with general approval from both the aboriginal and settler populations. Scarre argues that the apology was not appropriate because the people doing the apologizing did not have "ownership" of the wrongful deeds. While he defends the legitimacy of "insider-regret," a particular form of negative reactive attitude towards one's group's historical injustices, Scarre denies that this attitude can ground the practice of apology. Debates about the nature of collective responsibility are well established in the literature and are not much advanced by the arguments to be found here. However, Scarre's essay does provide opportunity for reflection on the nature and functions of apology. Scarre's clear and straightforward account of when an apology can be given and what functions it can perform is quite narrow and so leaves the reader reflecting on what a broader concept of apology might look like.

Finally, literary scholar Jakob Lothe provides a reading of W. G. Sebald's novel Austerlitz. Sebald was a writer who was born in Germany in 1944 but who lived most of his adult life in England. His fiction and non-fiction writings have become important to current discussions of how German identity has been shaped by the memory of World War II and the Holocaust. The narrator of the novel, who, like Sebald, is a German exile of the immediate postwar generation, develops an unusual friendship with a Jewish man who survived the Holocaust as a child and is now attempting to recover the story of his parents' lives and deaths in the camps. Lothe argues that Sebald's narrative techniques reveal that the main theme of the novel is forgiveness. This claim remains puzzling for much of the essay, but by the end it becomes clear that Lothe's theme is not 'what is involved in granting forgiveness,' but instead 'what it is like to feel the need to be forgiven for the injustices of previous generations.' As such, the essay is fruitfully paired with Scarre's contribution.


Griswold, C. L., Forgiveness: A Philosophical Exploration, Cambridge University Press, (2007).

Murphy, J. G. and J. Hampton (eds.), Forgiveness and Mercy, Cambridge University Pres, (1988).

Murphy, J. G., Getting Even, Oxford University Press, (2003).