The Ethics of History

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David Carr, Thomas R. Flynn, and Rudolf Makkreel, (eds.), The Ethics of History, Northwestern University Press, 2004, 263pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0810120275.

Reviewed by John Zammito, Rice University


The phrase "ethics of history" is intrinsically polyvalent, and the editors of this volume acknowledge the "novelty and ambiguity" of the juxtaposition of ethics with history. (vii) No one can be insensitive to the importance of the considerations entailed, least of all practicing historians or philosophers of history. Hence the organization of a conference on this theme in 1998, from which the essays have been culled, made eminent sense. What remains is to consider what sense the essays have made of the theme.

The volume is organized in three parts, reflecting the commonalities the editors could find among the contributions. The first part is entitled "Historical Representation," articulating what the editors perceive as a ubiquitous "critique" of the conventional notion of historical representation. This "critique" is animated, they believe, by a recognition first of an "unbridgeable" gap between the historian and the past, and hence as well of the inescapable impact of the subjectivity of the historian in the (re)construction. Such subjectivity has, they continue, not only aesthetic but also ethical dimensions (viii-ix). Not unreasonably, the editors take these commonalities for a general endorsement of postmodernist insight. Hence the second part of the volume expounds "Postmodernist Challenges" (to conventional historical representation). Working through these challenges ushers in the closing part, on "History and Responsibility," which proposes to harvest the insights into the "ethics of history." The volume ends, however, with some reservations expressed by David Carr regarding the postmodernist assimilation of history to fiction. He finds in the postmodern position "a number of confusions and untenable tacit assumptions concerning the nature of fiction, the role of imagination in knowledge, and the relation between narrative and historical reality." (259) Not only do I find Carr's comments apt, but I suspect as well that they could serve to turn the whole discussion in a different direction.

To assess the volume, I suggest we distinguish at least heuristically between "cognitive virtues" and cultural responsibility. This may parallel, in some measure, Jürgen Rüsen's proposal to discriminate "theoretical" from "practical" truth (196). My meaning is that one central way of construing the "ethics of history" is in terms of the historian's obligation to "get it right," that is, to adhere to some standard of "truth-telling." Allan Megill takes the strongest stance along these lines in the volume, arguing that "the epistemology of historical investigation is closely connected to the ethics of historical investigation" (46), and concluding: "The fundamental obligation of historians is to the maximal telling of truth, maximally keyed to the weight of the available evidence. Here is where the only ethics of history worthy of the name is to be found." (66) But there is another -- more conventionally "moral" -- sense, which strongly pervades the volume, of cultural responsibility -- to the past, to the present, and even to the future. Rüsen puts it clearly: "To whom is the historian responsible and for what? And how are these values and this responsibility effective in the historical work?" (196)

In terms of historical practice, as Megill puts it, "the obligation to offer reasons for one's truth-claims is an ethical and not merely a technical obligation." (55) Of course, the issue is what kinds of truth-claims historians can make and how they can offers reasons for them. Megill is confident that there are well-established "rules for arriving at historical truth." (48) In at least some measure, Rüsen seems to share this view and even to extend it toward what seems quite non-postmodern, namely the old "value-free" notion of "scientific" objectivity. I think things are considerably more problematic. Here, precisely, the challenges posed by Frank Ankersmit, Edith Wyschogrod and Joseph Margolis to conventional historical representation need to be taken up, especially in terms of the ethical and epistemological meanings of "historical truth." That term throngs Ankersmit's essay obtrusively notwithstanding what seems to me his failure to define it. Moreover, I suspect it is incongruous with his long-established theory of historical representation, which he here reiterates. It is not clear that Ankersmit succeeds in explaining "why truth and value can come so infinitesimally close to each other in the practice of historical writing" (18) except in the sense that both are derived from the aesthetic of representation. To write "in praise of subjectivity" on this line, hitching both ethics and truth in history to the aesthetic form of representation, leaves one skeptical as to whether "we will go to the heart of reality with representation" (13), or simply express idiosyncratic visions. Edith Wyschogrod, taking up Foucault, affirms an "ideal of historical truth" while abandoning representation altogether. Her "heterological history" is a form of fiction, but fiction is a very sophisticated form in poststructuralist hands. In any event the old idea of representation (narratives of "before and after") is foreclosed by the "atomic" isolation of past "discursive regimes" (Foucault), since the ruptures between them are unbridgeable in principle. She acknowledges such a view "can lead to a metaphysics of unamended difference and dissemination" (41), but she insists there are sufficient "constraints on what can be said or shown" (42) to preempt this mise en abîme. It is ethical responsibility, "liability for the Other" (30), which raises these constraining demands, reasserting "before and after" as an "imperative" to take up the sufferings of past others. It is the historian's "erotic" passion for the claims of memory (of the Other) which encodes ethics into history. In Foucault's formulation: "'Whose truth is being told, to whom, by whom and to what end?'" (42) Most interesting is Joseph Margolis, who argues at one and the same time that, in a post-positivist philosophical order, there can only be "constructivism all the way down" (175, 184) and yet neither intelligibility nor responsibility need be forsaken. If there is a "dampening [of] objectivity" (195) which appears "inescapably relativistic" (186), this seems to Margolis largely a matter of time: "Conviction tends to outstrip legitimation at any moment; but, over time and well after the fact, the two are more closely reconciled. This often requires the rewriting of history and the reassessment of norms." (188)

How does that square with the other concern: the historian's cultural responsibility -- to the past, the present and the future? As John Caputo puts it, "history and justice come too late for the dead." (92) Belated "reconciliation" buys into the fatal compromise of all theodicy; it fails to face squarely the irredeemability of loss. That is what makes acute for several of the authors in the collection Arthur Danto's unanswered question: "have we some kind of duty to the past itself to find out its truth?" (82) And should that duty be, as Caputo follows Benjamin and Levinas in suggesting, to undertake the (impossible) redemption of past suffering? Caputo draws richly on Levinas to explore this impossible obligation, which also lies at the heart of Wyschogrod's reflections. In a way, what seems to flow from the anguished reflections in their essays, along with more measured echoes in Danto and Rüsen, is the notion that the "irreparability of the past" must be juxtaposed to the "open-endedness of the future" (115) in an effort to provide orientation in the present (Rüsen's key idea of Orientierungsbedürfnisse). Megill puts this emphatically: historians are "obliged to reflect on the ethical significance of the past for us, now," (54) a "relation primarily to … the continuing present." (61) Rudolf Makkreel reinvokes the larger tradition of philosophy of history from Kant, arguing that "only an authentic moral theodicy that is rooted in our moral compass can orient us towards the future," hence the historian's hermeneutic obligation to "make as much sense of history as is needed to keep moral hope alive." (218) But does ought imply can, here? And is the practicing historian really in the business of theodicy?

The notion of an "ethics of history" comes out of this collection as problematic as its overture foretold. Though for somewhat different reasons, I think Ankersmit's claim that in historical writing truth and value are utterly commingled seems essential. After all these essays, it is still not clear how to resolve what Steven Crowell once called the "mixed messages" of historical writing. (History and Theory 37 (1998)) Makkreel's suggestion that we should consider with more discrimination the relation between the "reflective" and the "reflexive," between "responsiveness" to the ambiguities of the historical object and the "responsibility" of the historian to the ethical imperatives of the present, proposes more than etymological kinships. "Whereas reflection leads consciousness outside itself, the reflexive allows consciousness to relate to itself." (223) Bringing hermeneutics and history together, Makkreel suggests that "hermeneutics requires an ethic of responsiveness to one's subject matter, whereas history requires an ethic of responsibility." (228) Authenticity requires that however "theoretically indeterminate" a historical judgment may have to be, the historian must show a "determinate practical consciousness." (218) That path seems to hold promise for further exploration.