The Ethics of Husserl's Phenomenology; Responsibility and Ethical Life

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Joaquim Siles i Borràs, The Ethics of Husserl's Phenomenology; Responsibility and Ethical Life, Continuum, 2010, 209pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441174697.

Reviewed by Henning Peucker, University of Paderborn, Germany


First the bad news: this book is not, as the reader might well expect on the basis of its title, a book on Husserl's ethics. Joaquim Siles i Borràs does not investigate Husserl's ethics and does not even take into account the two volumes in the Husserliana series containing the majority of Husserl's ethical writings (28 and 37), which incidentally have not yet been translated into English. Instead, this book investigates the hidden ethos or moral attitude that underlies Husserl's phenomenology as a whole and its development. Thus, Siles i Borràs understands ethics not simply as dealing with moral normativity, but rather in a much broader sense. As a result, he attempts to show that Husserl's phenomenological epistemology in general and its basic methodological principle of presuppositionlessness in particular have ethical relevance. This basic principle calls for radical freedom from prejudice and dogmatism as an ethical demand, a demand that the later Husserl combines with an ideal of absolute and universal self-responsibility. Thus Siles i Borràs sees phenomenology as ultimately grounded in an ethical attitude of reflective self-responsibility. Ethics is therefore not secondary to epistemology but founds it on the basis of an ethical demand of rigor and radical self-responsibility. The thesis of this book is that this ethical demand -- it would perhaps be better to speak about the ethos of the phenomenological philosophy than of its ethics -- guides Husserl's work and drives its development of increasing radicalization from beginning to end. This leads Siles i Borràs to a set of slightly ambiguous claims, viz., that phenomenology (i) is "an ethical project" (5), (ii) is an "ethical life" (18, 49), (iii) is an "ethical inquiry" (19, 30) or -- perhaps most precisely -- (iv) is motivated by an ethical demand (19).

The book comprises five chapters in which Siles i Borràs delves into almost all of the central topics in Husserl's writings. The first chapter begins by presenting Husserl's critical analysis of the situation of modern science. Husserl blames the sciences for masking the spiritual life of the human being. The positivistic attitude of modern science permeates Western humanity to the extent that it objectifies and reduces human existence in such a way that it loses its orientation and meaning. According to Husserl, these problems can only be cured by a revitalization of the forgotten original philosophical spirit of both science and European culture. Therefore, it becomes an ethical task to conquer the loss of faith in the meaning of European humanity by a renewal or rebirth of the original philosophical stance of science. Here phenomenology comes into play, since it both reminds us of the Greek idea of science as a presuppositionless undertaking and provides us with a modern method for presuppositionless inquiry. Husserl understands his phenomenology in the Crisis and the Kaizo-articles as the teleological fulfilment of the original ideal of science and human culture. Thus, practicing phenomenology gains ethical relevance because it aims to renew the ideals of science, genuinely human culture, and meaningful existence.

Against this background, Siles i Borràs undertakes his extensive investigation of the core elements of Husserl's theoretical phenomenology. He first focuses on the core methodological instruments of phenomenology: the epoché, the intuition of essences, and the transcendental reduction. He understands the epoché as embodying the spirit of Cartesian philosophy. This is not because the epoché has anything to do with Cartesian doubt but because it is an expression of the same radical epistemological impetus that we find in Descartes' philosophy. The epoché neutralizes or puts out of action all of our theses about worldly objects and the world itself, inaugurating a new attitude from which the phenomenological philosophy commences. This account is, according to Siles i Borràs, not only epistemologically relevant but also of ethical importance, since it expresses the universal ethical demand for autonomy and presuppositionlessness that guides Husserl's philosophy (cf. 26, 30). By performing the epoché, the phenomenologist gains access to the new realm of transcendental subjectivity, which is always related to some objectivity or other. The uncovering of the correlation between cogito and cogitatum that belongs to the intentional immanence of consciousness (not to the "reell" immanence, as Siles i Borràs maintains, drawing on Husserl's lectures on the Idea of Phenomenology -- see 25, cf. 30, 64) is a result of performing the epoché.

Because Husserl understands phenomenology as an eidetic science of transcendental subjectivity (cf. Ideas I, §75), the eidetic method has almost the same importance for phenomenology as the epoché. Siles i Borràs tries to clarify the notion of eidetic science, but he does not always separate the epoché and the intuition of essences clearly enough (see, e.g., 29). These two methodological procedures, however, should not be conflated, since in the Logical Investigations (before he ever talked about the epoché), Husserl already conceived of phenomenology as an eidetic science, and even in Ideas I he introduced his distinction between facts and essences independently of and prior to his discussion of the epoché. Furthermore, Siles i Borràs's description of the transcendental reduction as a "radicalization" or an "intensification of the epoché" (32) is unusual. He claims, somewhat metaphorically, that the transcendental reduction delves deeper into the original sphere of consciousness than the epoché. He is surely right, however, to maintain that the reduction leads us not only to the sphere of act-consciousness but also to the pure ego that unites or synthesizes all of our acts in something like the way that the Kantian "I think" functions as a condition of possibility for our experience. He also interprets the result of the transcendental reduction as a sphere of ownness that includes the living body and does not exclude the other. The first chapter ends with an analysis of Husserl's theory of intersubjectivity as presented in the fifth Cartesian Meditation.

The second chapter begins with a section devoted to the special role of intuition in phenomenology. According to Husserl, intuition functions as "a source of authority for knowledge" and attains the role of "a principle of principles" for phenomenology (Ideas I, §24). Siles i Borràs sees this epistemological function as being intertwined with the ethical demand for a presuppositionless re-grounding of science. Since such a new science should proceed in a philosophical manner, it is ultimately able to answer "questions concerning the meaningfulness of the human being and thus renew humanity into a true and authentic humanity" (77). Within this framework Siles i Borràs maintains that intuition is even "the first ethical principle" (65). Claims like these may justify his extensive analysis of three forms of intuition in Husserl: simple perception, the intuition of essences, and categorial intuition.

In the second part of the chapter, Siles i Borràs investigates the relationship between intuition and thought or reason. He explores the way Husserl shows how intentions fulfill signifying acts and are thus crucial for knowledge. Siles i Borràs then remarks that rationality sets the formal logical and ontological laws that prescribe what can be intended in any possible intention and therefore also prescribe the possibilities for any intuitive fulfillment. In short, Siles i Borràs claims, "rationality of thought must prescribe the rules of our seeing" (76). He does not resolve the tension between these two approaches to intuition by making a clear distinction between an epistemological and an ontological perspective. Instead he concludes at the end of the chapter that the demand for a presuppositionless grounding of knowledge through intuition has only the status of a regulative idea in the Kantian sense.

Since the principle of intuition regulates the limits of the phenomenological inquiry itself, Siles i Borràs asks (in the third chapter) how the presuppositionless investigation of phenomenological consciousness is itself possible. The leading question here is how the phenomenological experience of our own act-consciousness is possible. This leads Siles i Borràs to a close reading of Husserl's theory of inner perception and immanent intuition in which, according to Husserl, acts and our own lived-experiences ("Erlebnisse") are absolutely given. Siles i Borràs investigates the problem of the self-givenness of phenomenological consciousness in this and the following chapter.

This problem is particularly difficult if one bears in mind the temporal structure of consciousness. The question arises how the phenomenologist can intuitively thematize the whole stream of lived-experiences if each of these experiences always flows away before it can be grasped. It seems that the inner perception that happens in the now-consciousness can only give single parts of the whole stream of consciousness and not the whole ego intuitively. Siles i Borràs tackles this problem of the possibility of an intuitive givenness of the ego in meticulous detail, displaying an impressive familiarity with Husserl's writings on time-consciousness. His analysis shows quite clearly that our reflective acts are limited to the now-consciousness and that the whole flux of lived-experiences always goes beyond that. Therefore the original givenness of the Heraclitean flux of consciousness is not made possible by means of a thematizing reflective act. Instead our awareness of the life of consciousness is based on a passive and pre-reflective form of self-awareness that accompanies every intentional experience immediately. Thus every experience, every explicit intentional consciousness-of, is itself experienced within a pre-reflective self-awareness (cf. 124, 130). This sphere of pre-reflective self-awareness includes, according to Siles i Borràs, not only internal time-consciousness but also an original consciousness of our own living body and the co-experience of the other. As a result, subjectivity is already at this very basic level of consciousness permeated by the other (cf. 126ff).

Siles i Borràs interprets Husserl's investigations of time-consciousness in connection with the general ethical demand that underlies Husserl's phenomenology. This demand for a radical self-grounding forces Husserl to raise the difficult question of what allows phenomenological consciousness to give itself to itself intuitively (cf. 105, 125), which in turn leads back to the investigation of the very structure of time-consciousness. Siles i Borràs, rather metaphorically, sees in these investigations the "ethical depth" of Husserl's phenomenology (105ff).

For this reason he asks in the final chapter of his thorough study whether the problem of the givenness of the entire stream of consciousness to itself leads Husserl to the limits of his phenomenological principle of intuition. The inner time-consciousness operates as a pre-phenomenal condition for every possible phenomenon or, to put it differently, as the beginning of all of our intentional activities. Husserl himself admits that we do not even have the appropriate language to describe the occurrences in this pre-phenomenal stream, since our words are relating to something in the phenomenal field but not in the pre-phenomenal consciousness that constitutes it. The pre-phenomenal time-consciousness remains anonymous and it seems that the phenomenologist does not have the appropriate means to grasp and intuit this stream.

It is exactly this problem that leads Husserl, according to Siles i Borràs, to the method of genetic phenomenology that goes beyond the investigation of act-intentionality by delving into the motivational origin of the act-consciousness. Here Husserl reveals, almost like an archaeologist inside consciousness, a pre-predicative and pre-egoic dimension that pre-constitutes the objects of our explicit act-intentionality. It is this dimension of hyletic sensations and affections that can have an effect on the ego if it turns its gaze towards that which arouses its interest. This pre-egoic dimension of consciousness is a remote and latent background-consciousness that always functions passively as a motivational basis for the act-consciousness. Husserl's attempt to illuminate this most basic level of consciousness-life is an expression of the radical and critical self-reflection that defines Husserl's phenomenology. Siles i Borràs interprets this phenomenological uncovering and elucidation of the genesis of the intentional consciousness as a manifestation of Husserl's quest for a radical self-foundation. According to Siles i Borràs, the critical examination of the ultimate origin of consciousness-life is a manifestation of an ethical attitude of reflexivity that characterizes Husserl's entire philosophy. The phenomenological striving for radical self-responsibility culminates in Husserl's attempt to elucidate the inner-subjective genesis of our consciousness-life as systematically as possible. Siles i Borràs stresses at the end of the book that Husserl understands these investigations as the fulfillment of the original spirit of philosophy as founded by the Greeks which needs to be reactivated through an ethical life of radical self-responsibility.

The strength of this book is that it sheds new light on Husserl's entire work from a perspective that has hitherto received little attention; an investigation of this kind has never been undertaken as thoroughly as in this study. Even if Siles i Borràs interprets some of Husserl's concepts and insights rather problematically, he manages to show that ethics is considerably more central to Husserl's phenomenology than most interpreters believe it to be.