The Ethics of Killing: Problems at the Margins of Life

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McMahan, Jeff, The Ethics of Killing: Problems at the Margins of Life, Oxford University Press, 2002, 560pp, $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 0195079981.

Reviewed by Michael Lacewing, Heythrop College


Jeff McMahan’s The Ethics of Killing seeks to achieve two objectives, it seems to me. The first is to defend a particular theory of the rights and wrongs of killing, in particular abortion and euthanasia, on the basis of a theory of personal identity. With a careful application of metaphysics to ethics, McMahan has developed a field of argument that has been insufficiently explored, and in so doing, created a whole new structure for the debates surrounding abortion and euthanasia. This makes this a novel and, at times, exciting book. The second objective is to survey the literature on the rights and wrongs of killings and show why alternative theories are wrong. This makes the book comprehensive, very long, and, at times, trying.

McMahan begins from the very beginning – to develop an ethics of killing, it is essential that we first establish when it is we kill an entity “of a sort that you and I once were, or might become” (3). Was I ever a fetus? Could I suffer from severe cognitive impairment, or will I, by then, have ceased to exist? To answer these questions, we must first establish what kinds of entities we are. After arguing comprehensively against substance dualism, hylomorphism, and the theory that we are organisms, McMahan develops a theory that claims we are embodied minds. I began to exist with the onset of (the capacity for) consciousness in ‘my’ organism.

The identity of a mind is given, in some way, by a continuity of consciousness. This could be just a matter of psychological connections within the contents of consciousness: desire and its fulfillment, continuation of belief, experience and its memory, etc. Derek Parfit has claimed that identity is given by psychological continuity – overlapping chains of strong psychological connectedness, where strong psychological connectedness holds just in case at least half the number of psychological connections as are normally present in persons hold. But it follows from this that, if – as seems likely – infants do not have strong psychological connectedness day-to-day, I am not identical with the conscious being of the infant that became me – so who was this conscious being? Likewise, should I contract Alzheimer’s, when the number of day-to-day connections decreases below half the normal number, I will cease to be, and some other conscious being will exist instead – who is this?

McMahan replaces Parfit’s account by the claim that a consciousness is the same consciousness if 1) there is any degree of psychological connectedness, and 2) it is sustained by physical and functional continuity, i.e. enough of the same brain must continue to exist and work to support the same consciousness (this latter condition is needed to distinguish identity from qualitatively identical replication in cases such as teletransportation). McMahan admits that (2) is not very well established, but it is also less important morally, as psychological continuity without physical continuity is not something we yet need to take into account in practical ethics.

McMahan combines this account of identity with an account of ‘what matters’. This idea can be understood through that of ‘egoistic concern’: “Each of us has a special sort of concern for his or her own future…[which] is different from our attitude to the future experiences of others.” (41) At first blush, egoistic concern appears to be based upon identity. However, McMahan argues that it – or rather a technical variation on it – can be present in some cases where identity is not preserved, e.g. if the two hemispheres of my brain were separated and transplanted into two different bodies. So instead of identity mattering, the bases for egoistic concern are 1) the physical and functional continuity of those parts of the brain in which consciousness is realized; and 2) psychological unity, a function of the proportion of mental life sustained, the richness of that mental life, and the degree of internal reference between mental states (i.e. a function of psychological continuity and connectedness). Normally, these criteria equally support identity, but, as in the split brain case, need not always.

This distinction between identity and the bases of egoistic concern forms the crux of the entire book. The practical application of this distinction lies in the fact that, unlike identity, the bases for egoistic concern can be present in degrees. Rational egoistic concern varies primarily with the degree of psychological unity. McMahan makes a distinction between a being’s interests – goods over its whole life – and its time-relative interests – goods it has rational egoistic concern for at a particular time (80). The latter factor in the degree to which the bases for egoistic concern hold between the time of having the interests and when the goods/bads will be realized. This distinction in turn produces two theories of the badness of death: the Life Comparative Account (LCA), which claims the badness of death is proportional to the total value of the interests thwarted; and the Time-Relative Interest Account (TRIA), which claims that the badness of death is proportional to the strength of the victim’s time-relative interest in continuing to live, i.e. it additionally takes into account the degree of rational egoistic concern for this future value.

One advantage of the latter account is explaining why the death of a fetus can be less bad than that of an adult human. If LCA were correct, this death would be worse, because more good would be lost. But TRIA takes into account the fact that a fetus is not related to its future in ways that matter. In particular, if a being has no psychological unity over time, then there is little reason to care for its sake if it continues to live. Its future is related to it now much like the future of another being.

The wrongness of killing is distinct from the badness of death, for in the case of persons, it is not proportional to the amount of good lost. Here McMahan defends a morality of respect, on the basis that we do not discriminate the wrongness of killing someone by their time-relative interests. These can vary dramatically from one person to another – young, old, gifted, ungifted, and so on. But killing a person is equally wrong in each case because it violates respect for the person.

The controversial results of McMahan’s theory are clear: the wrongness of killing human beings who have little psychological unity, such as fetuses, infants, and the congenitally severely cognitively impaired, is proportional to their time-relative interests, and these are not strong. (Congenital, rather than acquired, cognitive impairment is important, as those who once were persons may continue to be covered by the morality of respect.) Killing human beings with no more capacity for rich psychological unity than animals is no more wrong than killing animals (taken in isolation from the myriad side-effects on other people, etc.). Killing animals is a serious matter, McMahan argues, but the harm involved (the frustration of time-relative interests) can be outweighed by other interests. He considers at length and rejects claims such as that membership in the human species matters, that the potential to develop the psychological capacities that underlie egoistic concern matters, or that human life is sacred in some way. He admits that some readers will take the fact that his theory must permit infanticide when there are sufficiently strong interests opposing the life of the child as a reductio ad absurdum, and expresses his unhappiness at this result. He also expresses agreement with those who feel that putting such judgments into practice would constitute a dangerous slippery slope. But he defends his position by pointing out that no moral theory has so far proved capable of uniting and defending all our intuitions on these matters.

As one would expect in a book this length, there are plenty of places where the reader will disagree with McMahan’s argument (if not also his conclusions). There are, for example, difficulties with the idea that the acquisition of a mind is an event that marks the origin of an entirely new metaphysical entity – what can we say of the status of those animals on the ‘borders’ of mindedness? Are they organisms or embodied minds, or a third type of entity altogether? I shall discuss two more general issues that I feel affect the book as a whole.

If TRIA is a general theory of the wrongness of killing, persons excepted, then aborting a fetus prior to the development of consciousness (from around 20 weeks) is no more wrong than killing a plant – for there are no time-relative interests to take into account. It is, as McMahan claims, “morally indistinguishable from contraception” (269), aside from the effects on the mother and others. Suppose that we are organisms, not embodied minds, but that McMahan is right about the bases of egoistic concern being what matters. I would then have been a non-conscious fetus, but this would not change this conclusion. The entire importance of the discussion of the theory of identity, therefore, is channeled through the claim that it is the bases of egoistic concern, not identity itself, that matter.

Curiously, McMahan spends very little time on the concept of egoistic concern, and it is left at an intuitive level. This is unsatisfactory. The idea of egoistic concern makes intuitive sense because we are taking identity for granted. To prise the two apart, McMahan points to the split brain case in which egoistic concern is present without identity. But for this, McMahan must redefine egoistic concern as “a form of concern that is phenomenologically indistinguishable from concern for myself, but conceptually need not be focused on oneself.” (42) But it is questionable whether such a form of concern exists (is my concern in the split brain case indistinguishable from normal egoistic concern?), or if we believe it does, whether we have successfully separated it from the belief that identity is somehow still involved. McMahan does not discuss this.

In fact, McMahan is not presenting a straightforward redefinition of egoistic concern. He is seeking to convince us that in cases of egoistic concern as we intuitively understand it, viz. involving identity, the true basis for concern is not identity, but the two criteria he gives. If its content is simply concern for my future identical self, egoistic concern cannot be a matter of degree. (That he wants us to shift away from identity in actual cases of egoistic concern, not just hypothetical split-brain cases, is indicated by his application of the concept to actual fetuses, infants, and the severely cognitively disabled.)

For us to be persuaded by this shift in understanding of the content for egoistic concern from my future self as identical to my future self as psychologically connected to me now, the shift cannot be very great. We might be persuaded that identity is not what matters only if something a lot like identity does. This consideration is part of McMahan’s argument for the two bases for egoistic concern, for they are equally the bases of identity in normal cases. So it is important that he has defended the right theory of identity. If we are organisms rather than embodied minds, then we ought to be egoistically concerned with all states of our organismic existence, from conception to organismic death. Now it is not implausible that we do have some such concern (is aborting a 19-week fetus morally indistinguishable from contraception, or do we have some concern for its own sake? can I not have concern for my existence in an irreversible coma? what of our concern for our corpses?). McMahan needs to argue that this is not egoistic concern, but he does not. In fact, he has loaded the dice by implicitly defining egoistic concern as our attitude to our future experiences, which presupposes a psychological account of identity. McMahan would greatly strengthen his argument if independent reasons could be given for identifying his bases of egoistic concern as correct, based on a deeper analysis of the nature of egoistic concern.

It seems to me that some account involving TRIA is necessary to capture our strongest intuitions about the death of fetuses. McMahan rightly remarks that, if we felt that fetal death was as significant as the death of an adult, the fact that two-thirds of pregnancies end in spontaneous miscarriage would constitute a disaster of epic proportions (165). Again, many people believe abortion becomes harder to justify the later it is carried out. TRIA can account for this in terms of the development of the bases for egoistic concern; LCA has a much greater problem, since the future value of the life remains essentially unchanged.

But is TRIA adequate on its own? I think not. A second objection I have to McMahan’s argument is regarding his methodology, or rather, his implementation of it. He declares:

in moral theory I take intuitions that are deeply and pervasively held to be presumptively reliable… if I am able to identify a unified foundation for our intuitions, I will also try to determine the extent to which it is rationally defensible and how it might be made more rigorous and coherent. (104)

I have a great deal of sympathy with this methodology of starting from where we are and solving the aporia that starting point presents. But if McMahan takes his methodology from Aristotle, he certainly doesn’t take much else. Almost no intuitions that deal with the virtue of an act are considered – but this is surely not because we have no such intuitions! With the exception of the killing of persons, when deontological intuitions are considered, almost the entire argument focuses on harm as measured by interests and the ‘intrinsic nature’ of the act and its victim. In the discussion of infanticide, McMahan acknowledges that under certain circumstances, killing infants can seem worse than killing persons, an intuition that clashes with his theory of killing:

This is partly because the killing of an infant by a soldier is so glaringly a wanton, gratuitous, pointless, and cowardly act. But it is also because we have an overwhelmingly poignant sense of the innocence, purity, vulnerability, and helplessness of the victim, which arouses our protective and nurturing tendencies. (340)

But none of these intuitions, which involve a whole new set of evaluations of the act, are deemed relevant to McMahan’s argument, for he neither discusses them here, nor does he refer to them at any other point. Some may insist that there is no need to consider virtue for it is concerned solely with the character of agents, which should be distinguished from the rightness or wrongness of acts; I believe this insistence is a mistake. It is important to note that many of these intuitions are genuinely about the act, and not necessarily ‘just’ about the agent.

There is, to my mind, no obvious priority to be given to either the harm-based approach or the virtue-based approach (since we have both types of intuitions), but a theory of killing that ignores either is incomplete. McMahan cannot finally succeed in his project if he ignores a whole swathe of intuitions that are “deeply and pervasively held”. And this, I believe, vitiates the account he has developed until it can be shown that it is coherent with the intuitions he does not discuss.

This criticism will not move everyone, perhaps particularly because the vast majority of the literature on killing similarly ignores the virtue approach. McMahan’s book is not, by that standard, lacking. And despite my reservations, I believe McMahan has laid out a novel case for his conclusions that should inspire productive debate. I would recommend each of its chapters as distinct discussions to graduate students as excellent examples of a particular way of approaching these issues in personal identity theory (Ch. 1) and practical ethics (Ch. 2-5).