The Ethics of Preventive War

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Deen K. Chatterjee (ed.), The Ethics of Preventive War, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 255pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521154789.

Reviewed by Bas van der Vossen, UNC Greensboro


This collection brings together twelve essays on preventive war. There is a lot to like here. The collection addresses a very important and current issue. Its contributions cover a wide range of issues concerning preventive war, and it boasts a truly impressive line-up of highly accomplished authors coming from different disciplines and backgrounds. This volume is more than the sum of its parts. While some of the chapters contain genuinely interesting contributions to the debate, the volume is a little uneven. Some chapters stick to familiar territory, one or two are of dubious quality, and this reader would have liked to see a slightly heavier editorial hand.

Preventive war is controversial because it involves military attack in the absence of two commonly accepted justifications: self-defense and so-called preemption. Wars of self-defense are said to be justified (when they are) because they involve countries' responding to (unjust) initiations of military force. Wars of preemption are said to be justified (when they are) because they involve countries' responding to an imminent threat of an (unjust) initiation of force. The rationale for the latter is that one need not wait until unjust aggressors actually initiate their attacks before self-defense becomes permissible.

Commonly, the permissibility of such preemptive attacks is thought to be subject to rather strict conditions of imminence -- conditions tracing back to the 1837 Caroline case. On this view, preemptive attacks are permissible only if the threat of unjust aggression is "instant, overwhelming, leaving no choice of means and no moment for deliberation." (32) The case for preventive (as opposed to preemptive) war attempts to stretch the condition of imminence beyond this. Preventive wars respond to threats of attack that may be further in the future and more uncertain.

While the United States has unilaterally proclaimed that it does not consider preventive war unlawful, the standard view under international law is that preventive war is illegal, unless specifically approved by the UN Security Council. The debate on the moral status of preventive war has intensified since the US invasions of Afghanistan and Iraq in response to the terrorist attacks of 9/11 and, more recently, Iranian attempts at obtaining nuclear capabilities. The latter is discussed in an interesting and informative chapter by Alex Newton, which summarizes some of the key facts of the Iranian case as well as the basic legal standing of potential US preventive action, and argues that such action would be morally impermissible.

Others, however, think that these recent cases are cause for reconsidering the standard distinction between preemptive and preventive war. The chapters by Chris Brown and George R. Lucas, Jr. offer such arguments. Brown claims that the distinction between preventive and preemptive war "is difficult to sustain under twenty-first century conditions." (28) He thinks that we should loosen the Caroline-based constraints on preventive violence because the new threats must be intercepted at an early stage if they are to be intercepted at all. The reason Brown gives is that countries are now facing threats that are both more damaging and can materialize faster. (34)

The latter part of this idea is puzzling, however. If technological innovations shorten the time needed to launch an unjust attack -- "the average laptop can carry out a billion or more 'instructions per second.'" (34) -- presumably they also shorted the time needed to launch a preemptive attack in self-defense. So it is unclear why this point would count in favor of loosening the strictures on preventive war. The innovations of speed seem to cancel each other out. It is unfortunate that Brown does not discuss the defensive part of the equation here.

But there is more that is puzzling. Brown dismisses all rule-based moral reasoning, including Kant's Categorical Imperative, in a single paragraph, and proposes what he calls an Aristotelian view on which the morality of prevention is determined by the decisions of political leaders. The view is surprising, to say the least. Why deny that even the most conscientious leaders can (and often do) make unjust decisions? For Brown's view to seem at least initially acceptable, we need a lot more (and better) defense than he provides.

The highlight of this volume for readers seeking serious discussion of the ethical issues involved in preventive way is the chapter by Jeff McMahan. McMahan asks under what conditions people become liable to preventive attack. With the care and sophistication that is typical of his work, McMahan builds a (highly limited) case for when preventive attack may be justified. The basic case turns on two claims. One is that people can become liable to attack not just in virtue of unjustly attacking another, but also in virtue of developing the intention to do so. The other is that even unmobilized soldiers who are unculpably unaware of their government's preparations for attack can become liable to attack "if two conditions are satisfied: (1) that they chose to become members of the military, even if they did so under a certain degree of compulsion, and (2) that there is a substantial probability that they will obey an order to fight if it is given." (132) In both cases, McMahan argues that the "Subjective and objective conditions sufficient for liability are both present: a blameworthy intention and an increase in the objective probability [due to the intention] of a person's being wrongly killed." (126) And this remains true even though it is possible that would-be attackers might change their minds in the future.

The case McMahan builds is mostly of interest because it demonstrates, if successful, that preventive attack can at least sometimes be justified. This point is commonly denied -- indeed, it is denied by some of the other contributors to this volume. But McMahan's argument is no endorsement of many actual preventive wars. As he notes, the problem is that the people who are liable to attack because of their role in increasing the risk of future aggression are only a subset of the people targeted in preventive attacks. And the conditions of proportionality that apply to attacks to non-culpable persons are likely very strict indeed.

Two other philosophically interesting contributions are by Stephen Nathanson and Michael Blake. Nathanson defends the traditional view that all preventive wars are unjustified. His argument for this conclusion takes a rule-utilitarian form. Preventive wars, even the ones that remove real threats and have a high probability of success (if there are such cases), should not be allowed, says Nathanson, because allowing any such wars opens the door to abuse. We are on balance better off not allowing preventive wars at all because, he writes, "preventive wars may be launched against threats that would never materialize" and "history shows . . . that a permissive doctrine of preventive war leads to more wars, many of them unnecessary." (161)

Such an argument requires an assessment of the comparative risks of different possible implemented moral rules. Unfortunately, Nathanson does not offer any such careful assessment. All we get is the quick assertion that the allegedly preventive US involvement in Korea and Vietnam during the Cold War was unnecessary. Perhaps this is true; it is hard to know. But more of a defense is required for such a central claim. Similarly, Nathanson says not just that an overly permissive doctrine of preventive war will lead to too many wars, but that any doctrine of preventive war will have this effect. His motivation: "national leaders are not only fallible but are also often arrogant, reckless, and desirous of war." (163) But while Nathanson is certainly right about both the great perils of allowing unnecessary preventive wars, and the tendency of politicians to become bellicose once in office, this step too needs more support. Perhaps variations in the form of government that constrains politicians might have a sufficient constraining effect. Or perhaps suitable international institutions might be created that help avoid these worries. The rule-utilitarian argument requires that we carefully inspect and compare these possibilities before we are entitled to draw the kind of sweeping conclusions Nathanson proposes.

Blake asks whether the legal prohibition of preventive war makes a difference to the moral assessment of such attacks if governments are justified in believing that such an attack would be morally permissible. In a carefully argued chapter, he inspects three kinds of arguments for why governments might be obligated to obey international law in those cases: that there is a prior duty to obey international law, that there are supposed bad consequences of law-breaking, and that there are epistemic reasons to obey the law. Of these, Blake is most sympathetic to the epistemic argument, which can support at least the duty to seek "intersubjective agreement on the nature of the threats involved prior to military attack." (83) But as arguments for a duty to obey international law, Blake finds all of these approaches largely wanting. None is sufficient for concluding that states will always be duty-bound to refrain from preventive war in proportionate self-defense.

This conclusion seems correct. My only complaint about Blake's argument is that it does not seriously explore whether the rights of (at least) legitimate states can make a difference here. Blake's question concerns cases where it is reasonable for governments to believe that other states pose a significant future threat. And perhaps his explicit focus on the Bin Laden case made Blake assume that all such cases will concern illegitimate states. But this need not be. Countries can have reasonable evidence that legitimate states pose threats to their safety (including, for example, a threat of unjust preventive attack). Might (small) preventive attacks be justifiable in those cases? In passing, Blake offers the thought that the rights of attacked states ought to be "balanced" against the rights of self-defense of attacking states. (75) This is fine, of course, but does not take us very far. The important question is how to "balance" these rights. And in any case, talk of "balancing rights" here seems to signal that the strictures against preventive war need not be the same concerning legitimate and illegitimate states -- the latter presumably not having the same rights as the former.

These are some of the more interesting and rewarding pieces in this volume. Another contribution particularly worth reading is Larry May's argument for putting the International Criminal Court in charge of deciding whether preventive wars are to count as acts of aggression or justified self-defense.

Unfortunately there are also some chapters that readers do best to ignore. One example is the piece by the late Jean Bethke Elshtain, which meanders through some rather familiar issues loosely related to preventive war and humanitarian intervention, espouses plenty of strong opinions, but offers virtually no real arguments or evidence in support. Another is the chapter by Richard Falk, which sets out to inspect the (interesting) issue of the preventive role that threats can play in international relations, and promises to apply this to the case of Iranian attempts at acquiring nuclear technology. But Falk's piece is very unfocused -- discussing Cold War deterrence, an indictment of the bombing of Hiroshima and Nagasaki, Al-Qaeda, and the 1986 Nicaragua judgment, among other things -- and fails to offer any arguments, or even actually to discuss the Iran case. What is left is a litany of seemingly ideological assertions directed against the US and Israel, and the rather bizarre speculation (without, again, any support) that the world would in fact be safer if countries like Iran had nuclear capabilities. (97-8)

Falk's piece is not the only one with ideological overtones. Distaste for the Bush administration is palpable throughout the volume (for example in the chapters by Brown and C. A. J. Coady). This reader would have preferred the editor to have weeded some of this out, as it is frequently accompanied by claims or assertions that receive no support or reference. One example is the following statement by Falk, offered with no support or reference:

There is much evidence supporting the view that had American foreign policy been guided by international law with respect to the use of force ever since the Vietnam war and up through the Iraq war, its national economic and international political standing would be higher and its global leadership position more widely accepted. (91)

This hinders rather than furthers genuine analysis.

At other points, too, the editor might have used a somewhat heavier hand. There are a number of easily avoidable mistakes, such as faulty references ("David Walzer", (74)), typesetting errors (148), and Elshtain's factually incorrect assertion that the US 2003 invasion of Iraq was not illegal (16). And the volume's introduction fails to explain what preventive war is or how it is different from preemptive war, despite mentioning that the distinction is frequently confused. On balance, then, this is a successful, if somewhat uneven volume. Readers are advised to pick and choose.