The Ethics of Time: A Phenomenology and Hermeneutics of Change

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John Panteleimon Manoussakis, The Ethics of Time: A Phenomenology and Hermeneutics of Change, Bloomsbury Press, 2017, 209pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781474299169.

Reviewed by Felix Ó Murchadha, National University of Ireland, Galway


This is a rich and carefully structured book, which develops an account of time as essential to ethics through a discussion of phenomenological, theological and psychoanalytic themes. The ethics of time is to be read both as subjective and objective genitive: the temporal nature of ethics and the ethical nature of time. Time is to be understood here as movement and change, and central to ethics is the movement motivated by the perception of imperfection, of evil, guided by a sense of the good. The fundamental point here is that ethics and time are interrelated because time is only possible through a consciousness which is eschatologically orientated -- which glimpses perfection. What this means -- and this is what is being hinted at in speaking of the "scandal of the good" -- is that evil is a moment of the "temporalized unfolding of the good" (xiii).

The structure of the book reflects its theme. Part One, "Prolegomena to Any Future", lays out the points of theoretical access to the theme, the cosmology and the anthropology of movement. The second part, "The Scandal of the Good", is divided into three sections: "Being at the Beginning", "Being Divided" and "Final Being". Each (borrowing from Augustine's Confessions) is named as a garden -- the Garden of Eden, the Garden of Gethsemane and the Garden of Paradise. This amounts to a narrative of history, a Heilsgeschichte, deeply indebted to Augustine and the Christian account of salvation.

The historical trajectory of the book ranges from Anaxagoras to Kierkegaard, from the cosmology of change to its anthropology. A mediating figure is St. Maximus the Confessor, who sought to vindicate kinesis within Christianity. It is this same motivation that John Panteleimon Manoussakis shows animates Kierkegaard's account of sin which has cosmological as well as ethical significance: the reality of sin points to the centrality of history and the necessary imperfection of creation (13). Drawing on Augustine's discussion of memory in the Confessions Book X, Manoussakis demonstrates the centrality of constitutive absence, as later thematized in phenomenology. Indeed, as Husserl made clear perception is always inadequate, always imperfect and as such perception is always subject to the dynamics of desire. What such a dynamics brings out is the intensity (rather than extensity) of consciousness and to illustrate this Manoussakis discusses waiting.

He opposes two notions of waiting: one which we find in Origen, according to which history is the result of that boredom experienced by pre-existing souls, the other that of eschatological expectancy that does not even know on what it is waiting. Waiting in this sense is an activity, is indeed an intensity which is distinct from any extensive understanding of time as measure (23). For Origen pre-existing bodilesss and immaterial souls grew weary of divine love and contemplation and through their boredom began the 'throwing down' (katabole) resulting in the material world. Manoussakis turns to Maximus's critique here which -- though not naming Origen by name -- rejects the doctrine of the pre-existence of souls on the basis that it makes the creation of the visible world the result of sin and through the positing of an evil that constrains divine will shares the Manichean doctrine of two cosmic principles. The reference here to Manichaeism is crucial, and as Manoussakis makes clear he is -- in a very Augustinian fashion -- attempting to thread a middle ground between the Pelagian belief in human capacity for good independent of anything other than the initial grace of creation and the Manichean doctrine of two forces of good and evil. His reasoning (less explicit in relation to the Pelagian than the Manichean) is the same: to posit either creation as already perfected or as itself the result of evil in conflict with a good prior to all creation is to reduce time to cosmological and anthropological insignificance and in so doing undermine ethics itself. Reading time theologically in its 'salvic' dimension, it becomes not a catastrophe but rather a mode of participation in the process of perfection.

The figure who remains a dialogue partner throughout the book is St. Augustine, with whom Manoussakis begins the section "Being at the Beginning" with a discussion of the impossibility of autobiography due to the heteronomy of origins. The phenomenology of the self which he develops in this discussion of Augustine leads necessarily to a phenomenology of creation. As he puts it: "a phenomenology of creation cannot but be posited at the same time with, and as a corollary of, a phenomenology of the self." (43) Contrary to Heidegger, Manoussakis insists on the ultimacy of the difference of created and uncreated as that which at both ends of our history has been either absent (pre-Christian) or eclipsed (modernity). In modernity the distinction of ens creatum and ens increatum has been replaced by a distinction between the human and the natural. Drawing on Dietrich Bonhoeffer, Manoussakis shows how creation places freedom at the basis of all things in the notion of the ex nihilo. Phenomenologically, he argues, it is this which we encounter in nature -- becoming and change occurring in freedom. This is fundamental to consciousness itself which finds itself as that which it cannot initiate "a heteronomic beginning that, once began, it cannot be surpassed, transcended, or passed beyond by consciousness." (46)

Creation initiates change and movement, time and history, and, for Manoussakis, central to why this is, is the problem of evil. He argues that the fall and creation need to be thought as contemporaneous (sin at the beginning of time). Sin arises from a kind of impatience: "the first man sinned insofar as he wanted to achieve without waiting what was promised to him anyway but in due time." (60) History is not the result of sin, but rather creation is essentially historical, because time is "a movement toward perfection". (61) Sin as the "non posse non peccare (it is not possible not to sin)" is a compulsion to repetition, a "tic" which is precisely the incapacity to transcend itself. In this sense sin ends in boredom: contrary to Origen boredom is not the cause of sin, but its "insescapable effect" (61). Evil in this sense cannot be on an equal footing with the good, rather it is a privation of the good. Manoussakis seeks to interpret this as to mean that "the good is evil's self-realization as such in time. Evil is a moment in the temporal unfolding of the good." (76) He goes on to state: "Evil is . . . nothing more than the denial of life's trauma and as such, the nostalgia for non-existence, that is, the nostalgia for a timeless existence . . . the nostalgia for nothing itself." (77)

The second part of the book, the second garden, concerns the "diastemic nature of the fallen creation" (81) and again begins with Augustine' Confessions, specifically the experience of fallenness as separation from others in space and separation from oneself in time. Language as Manoussakis points out plays a double function in the Confessions as a symptom of separation and a symptom of unity. (82) In speaking of God rather than to him, language breaks down in a series of aporias. The self which is divided by its attempt to ground itself on itself comes to unity only through a return to God, which is precisely what the Confessions charts. The individual part of conversion for Augustine mirrors a historical path of humanity as such. At its roots is a duality in the self which Augustine speaks of in terms of the will or more specifically the "two wills". It is this difference in itself which Manoussakis charts as making the experience of freedom possible. But the very relation of consciousness to freedom is problematic, and Manoussakis affirms with Sartre here that consciousness is forever attempting to mask its own spontaneity. Manoussakis traces this insight back to Augustine who is the first in the history of ideas to affirm the arbitrariness of the will. The inability not to sin has its source in the will, or rather the conflict of two wills.

Following Augustine, Manoussakis is careful to avoid Manichaeism: the will which is bedazzled by its own freedom moves away from its own nature. This Augustinian thesis Manoussakis traces in Maximus's distinction between a natural and a gnomic will (the will of the deliberating subject). Fundamental here is the question of the eschatological destiny of will, which for Manoussakis amounts to the question whether the creaturely, temporal character of the creature still holds in 'God's kingdom'. Manoussakis is clear in his response: "human nature is perfected, even though its creaturely character remains." (91) He defends this view in a crucial passage where he affirms against Pelagianism firstly that perfection is impossible to attain naturally, and then goes on to state:

It is us . . . with our gnomic wills that keep taking detours away from that aim [of perfection already given to nature], delaying the process of our salvation -- yet . . . these long detours . . . are somehow instrumental to our salvation and . . . therefore, not only our gnōmē would not be abolished, but even its history, which is nothing else than history itself, must be upheld and preserved. (91)

The crucial argument here is that salvation is not a freedom from nature but a freedom for nature. Crucial to Manoussakis' argument is that salvation is not a matter of anonymous nature, but rather of the personal I. The individual, he affirms following Kierkegaard, is both himself qua individual person and an instantiation of human nature.

Manoussakis goes on to name the non-coincidence of the self with itself 'desire', which he says "temporalizes the self" (97) and he brings first Freud and then Lacan into dialogue with Augustine to tease of the genealogy of desire working through the latter's text. I cannot delve into the full depth of this analysis here except to bring forward three fundamental theses: firstly, that Augustine is here abandoning the "verticality of the Greek schema . . . for the sake of a communion between exteriority and interiority" (103) Secondly, language for Augustine is a remedy for painful absence (recalling Freud's example of the child's "fort/da" game), whereby what is at play in language is consciousness' intentional aim towards the absent by virtue of an absencing such that the total presence of present would mean the death of consciousness. At the core of both points is, thirdly, the body, through which the imperfection which is fundamental to desire is constitutive. The body puts a halt to the impatient desire to wipe out the duration of time either in terms of the past or future, both trajectories of which amount to the wiping out of the personhood of the self.

In his discussion of desire Manoussakis points to a contrast between "archaic ontology" which envisages being as outside time and history and a "dynamic ontology" which is informed by the Judeo-Christian vision of being one that "takes the beginning as its point of departure" (115). To think beginning is to think the "instant", the moment of newness and it is to think both the "nothing" in the sense of creatio ex nihilo out of which the world came and in innerworldly terms, in relation to the existent, it is to think being in general, what Levinas terms the 'il y a'. Through a nuanced analysis of Levinas and Lacan on desire of the other, Manoussakis argues that ironically God in Levinas ends up appearing as "a violent God whose lethal presence would leave us breathless and lifeless." (125) At the heart of the issue here is the Incarnation: without incarnation there can be no relation, and an encounter without mediation cannot be distinguished from an encounter with evil. Speaking in a Lacanian register he concludes that the God of the real is without temporal mediation or mediation of the face of the other; the real God on the other hand "welcomes mediation through time and embodiment" (126).

The third part, the third garden, is subtitled "Final Being" and begins with an analysis of hell. Two ideas of hell are central to this analysis, its punitive character and its eternity. The two are related: the punishment of hell in Greek literature is governed by a temporality of repetition. A discussion of Kierkegaard on despair shows the centrality of eternity to this analysis: the self is eternally tied to itself, hell is a condemnation to life, "a perpetual insomnia" (139) These two themes lead Manoussakis to the question of what is saved and what damned in the self. Drawing on Origen and (the Russian theologian) Pavel Florensky he gives one answer to this, namely that the good in us is saved and evil will be consumed by fire. But what this entails is a dichotomy of nature (a faceless abstraction shared by all) and the individual person. What is missing or forgotten in these accounts is the body, which Manoussakis points out is particularly ironic given the basis of the Christian account of salvation in the resurrection. Manoussakis's target here is the "old philosophical (Platonizing) contempt for the body" (149) and in his discussion he employs the phenomenological distinction of body (Körper) and flesh (Leib) to analyse sarx/caro and soma/corpus. Already in St. Paul's First Corinthians the resurrection is being understood in terms of two modalities of bodily existence, which are united in the individual. The eschaton is meaningful only if it is the individuality of the person is the point of reference both with respect to mortal and eschatological existence. The Greek dichotomies of body and soul, time and eternity, are being refused here in the name of an embodied being that precisely due to its weakness can be open to the eschaton.

For this reader a least one nagging question remains at the end of this remarkable book. As Manoussakis acknowledges, the book can be read as a theodicy, specifically a 'phenomenological theodicy', rooting the theodical in consciousness. It seems necessary to confront even such a theodicy with that which remains to all appearances unspeakable evil, evil of which there seems no trace of good, of which the past century has many instances. Does not even a phenomenological theodicy come to its limits where evil descends to the unspeakable? In short, while I agree that time and history are essential to ethics, it seems still problematic to claim that all history is by that token redeemable.

Through an erudite and wide knowledge of the philosophical and theological traditions and also through his insights, displayed throughout this book, into drama, music and film, Manoussakis has shown how time and ethics can inform the understanding of each other. This is a profound and challenging book in which the temporal constitution of the ethical is shown to be the ethical nature of time.