The Ethics of Trade and Aid: Development, Charity or Waste?

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Christopher D. Wraight, The Ethics of Trade and Aid: Development, Charity or Waste?, Continuum, 2011, 178pp., $19.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781441125484.

Reviewed by Aine Donovan, Dartmouth College


Debate has raged for many years about the ethical policies of who to trade with, why we should (or shouldn't) trade, and when developing nations should engage in trade with more developed countries. In the past this has largely consisted of academic discussions among policy wonks and applied ethicists, but in recent years the debate has flowed to the classroom, the workplace, and the dinner table. To that end, Christopher Wraight's contribution to understanding the complexity of this issue is invaluable. He has written a thorough account of the issue of trade and aid, provided a complete overview of the philosophical framework, and presented the competing arguments for and against trade. This is a feat not easily achieved, and Mr. Wraight is to be commended for his ability to straddle both the purely academic world and the non-academic world. An average person who has an interest in this issue will find this book clear, comprehensive, and thoroughly understandable. Those of a more scholarly bent will, no doubt, take pleasure in seeing how issues as complex as ethical and economic theory are woven into understandable passages that shed light and clarity into often dimly perceived notions.

Wraight's book is not easily categorized by discipline. It is, rather, a unique blend of disciplines that allows readers from various backgrounds to enter into the inquiry and take away a multi-faceted understanding of a deeply complicated social problem. The book most clearly seems useful in a classroom setting, whether an applied ethics course, a public policy course, or an environmental studies course. But it is also an essential reader for anyone with a serious interest in civic responsibility to those in need around the world.

The book has an easy flow that makes for pleasant reading, if at times morally uncomfortable. Wraight is unusual among philosophers in that he includes a historical perspective to the problem that places the issue in context and sets a foundation for framing the contemporary issue. The first chapter is a succinct overview of colonialism and its effect throughout the world. The lack of historical awareness in today's college students makes this chapter an essential ingredient in understanding the current problems of places like Africa. Wraight is able to present a vast amount of history and its attendant problems in a mere forty-five pages. Additionally, he weaves the economic fallout from Colonialism into the discussion with a clear eye and objective analysis. It is important to the understand that for a variety of reasons Africa is the only continent to slip further into poverty over the last half-century, and with the rise of wealth among so many others the moral question of obligation to help those in need is ever present.

From there, he deftly explains the problem most commonly asked among today's college students, "why should I care about a place and people I don't know, will never know, and who will never know me?" This is, from an educator's perspective, the most vexing of questions. Wraight presents, and explores, the various ethical orientations and bluntly addresses the most common responses from students: moral apathy or resignation that the problem is too large and can never be adequately resolved. Wraight's synopsis of ethical theory is not mere abstraction; he uses it to bring the reader to a decision point. Throughout the book he makes clear that action must be taken; moral apathy or cynicism is not an option for the globalized citizen of the twenty-first century. But he is careful to frame the choice in moral terms, asking: "in the broadest sense, what kinds of actions are the right ones: they ought to be compatible with the demands of global justice, and also ought to maximize well-being to the extent that it's possible to judge it sensibly" (p. 86). The reader is drawn into the moral realm but pushed beyond speculation and nudged to action; a rare quality for a moral philosopher. All too often social issues are framed as intellectual puzzles when, in reality, lives are at stake and action is required for social justice to prevail.

The push toward action brings Wraight to his most disturbing chapter (ch. 4), on the alternative approaches to giving throughout the world. The sad reality of Africa's decline in wealth, productivity, and quality of life for its people is staggering for the average person who would constitute Wraight's readership. The battle between aid organizations and corrupt local officials is enough to dismay even the most charitable individual; but Wraight's assessment is grounded in experience that few philosophers or social scientists can claim: on the ground experience. His insertion of personal experience in working with aid organizations makes the scholarly exploration a truly meaningful read. He pushes the reader toward alternative ways of dealing with poverty, ways that do not include celebrity rock concerts or drive-by altruism. Wraight's difficult chapter on how we have attempted (and failed) in giving aid could expand the wave of compassion exhaustion that has swept the world, but if the reader takes seriously his call for alternative methods of aid they will be inspired by his final chapter on trade.

Wraight's discussion of how trade can benefit developing countries is a refreshing perspective; he states bluntly that for aid to be meaningful concessions must be made by the "rich world". It is far from certain that a cry in the wilderness for a more equitable distribution of goods and services will have any impact on world leaders of wealthy countries. But the worldwide rumbling for better representation of the least advantaged at the table makes Wraight's book timely as well as enlightened. He has taken a worldwide issue, with varying degrees of successful responses, and placed it in context of history, moral choice, and public policy. The uniqueness of this book is the writer's ability to tell a compelling story through the lens of philosophical inquiry, with a reporter's touch and a social activist's heart. It is for this reason that Wraight's book stands to garner support from educators who are embracing the charge toward interdisciplinarity -- both teachers and students will be transformed by digging deep into this small but powerful work on a pressing moral issue for the new century.